Wittgenstein as Philosophical Tone-Poet: Philosophy and Music in Dialogue

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Béla Szabados, Wittgenstein as Philosophical Tone-Poet: Philosophy and Music in Dialogue, Rodopi, 2014, 225pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789042038578.

Reviewed by Garry L. Hagberg, Bard College


In this absorbing and culturally rich book Béla Szabados begins with the observation that the many remarks of Wittgenstein's on music, and the central role music played in his life and his thought, have not been given sufficient attention in the world of Wittgenstein scholarship. By the end of this carefully constructed and eminently clear study one sees why he says that, his having convincingly shown the extent to which Wittgenstein's engagement with music intertwines with his philosophical thought and the extent to which each casts special or unobvious light on the other.

Szabados works outward from a centrally important distinction: a number of commentators have seen Wittgenstein's remarks on, and interest in, music as a peripheral matter for him; that is, they see him centrally involved with problems in the philosophy of language, mind, and philosophical methodology, and so to the extent that they consider Wittgenstein on music at all they see this as a matter of applying those considerations in language, mind, and so forth to the understanding of music. Szabados proceeds (and this is the main reason this book is such a very valuable contribution not only to our understanding of Wittgenstein but also to our understanding of music itself) from a different premise: that Wittgenstein was deeply and constantly concerned with aesthetic questions, and that the aesthetic dimension of life was for him both always "on" and always a significant contributory factor in his thinking on the range of philosophical issues for which he is most known. Thus throughout this book (a) rather intricate relations between music and language, (b) the complexities of musical understanding, (c) the multiform ways in which representation, expression, and interpretation function within the world of musical experience, and (d) the power and centrality of aspect-perception in the comprehension of musical meaning, sense, and intellectual content are all explored with philosophical subtlety and cultural sophistication.

Szabados does an exemplary job of following Wittgenstein into the hidden depths of his remarks and observations on Bach, Beethoven, Mendelssohn, Schubert, Schumann, Brahms, Wagner, Bruckner, Mahler, and the perhaps unjustly obscure Josef Labor. But we see here not merely that Szabados clearly understands and engagingly communicates the content of Wittgenstein's observations; it is rather that Szabados repeatedly enacts the very kind of richly contextual aesthetic appreciation he finds endorsed by Wittgenstein. That is, Szabados sees and brings to light meaning-determining connections right and left -- between one remark on Bach and another on Josef Labor, or one on Brahms and another on Mendelssohn, or one on another art, e.g. architecture and another on the art of music, or one on the appreciation of a line of poetry and the taking in of the significance of a melody, and so on throughout the book.

All of this (as I will discuss more fully) points to the fact that Wittgenstein is not best understood as a hard-line musical formalist in the tradition of Hanslick. It is rather that Wittgenstein is constantly weaving the connecting fibers that show music's place within what he calls our form of life. It is thus not exclusively the relations within a work of music that generate its meaning (although these, as Szabados understands, unquestionably have their place in the creation and comprehension of musical sense). It is rather all of those internal compositional relations, seen themselves in relation to external and more broadly cultural matters -- our language, our expressive patterns, our social interactions, our modes of understanding each other, that make music meaningful.

In connection with this approach, Szabados rightly brings out Wittgenstein's remarks concerning the enormous and exacting labor that he expended on arranging his remarks; this was a philosopher who understood that sentences in our language are not reducible to isolated propositions that carry all of their content internally or hermetically. Rather, relations, interconnections, linkages, cast light and convey meaning, and Szabados acutely sees, and to my mind definitively shows, that Wittgenstein thought the same of music and the arts. And Szabados is alive to another important element in understanding Wittgenstein's life in music: saturated in a rich musical culture from childhood, he understood music in the way a performer does, or from, as we might say, the inside, from within musical practices. To take one example: when a conversation turned to a Beethoven quartet, Wittgenstein was able to accurately whistle the full viola part of the third movement in connection with what was being discussed. He was also able to whistle forty Schubert songs, with his friend David Pinsent accompanying on the piano (p. 28). This is important, beyond biographical interest, because it shows the extent to which Wittgenstein thought of music in the finest detail, on the most nuanced level of particularity. This clearly accords well with his philosophical approach generally, but the point here is that this early grounding in practice inoculated Wittgenstein against over-general pronouncements concerning issues such as the nature of musical meaning, the nature of the relation between music and ethics, and so forth. Indeed, we learn here that Wittgenstein said that there is an extraordinary number of different kinds of appreciation, but that his own was "concentrated and circumscribed" (p. 29), by which I think he meant both broadly culturally cultivated and yet microscopically focused on detail.

Szabados is expert at summoning the telling detail or anecdote for his larger purpose: He informs us of Maurice Drury's (Wittgenstein's friend and student) writing that before a Cambridge meeting he and Wittgenstein were talking and looking out of the window on a dull grey evening; when he said he had been listening to the impressive second movement of Beethoven's Seventh Symphony, Wittgenstein replied "The chord with which that slow movement opens is the colour of that sky (pointing out of the window)". But then he added (now interweaving a synesthetic observation about the music to a personal association to that music that still, if in a different way, tells us about the mood, the tenor or character, of that movement): "At the end of the war, when we were retreating before the Italians, I was riding on a gun carriage and I was whistling to myself that movement." And as quickly, but now moving back to a description of the music and not his personal interaction at a potentially life-threatening time with it, adds, "Just at the very end of the movement Beethoven does something which makes one see the theme in an entirely different light" (p. 31).

This, in microcosm, shows the network of relations that Szabados sees as the heart of Wittgenstein's involvement with music and his conception of music's capacity to create, hold, and convey meaning. If we were asked, "Is this (a) formal-analytical, (b) personally relational, (c) music-to-atmosphere relational, or (d) conversationally-dependent observation?", one would be right to answer "All of them -- and inseparably so". And the very idea of seeing a thing in an entirely different light is perhaps the deepest connection between Wittgenstein's conception of aesthetic experience and his conception of philosophical work and progress: he showed us the entire inherited problem of word-meaning in, indeed, an entirely new light -- beyond Frege, beyond Russell, and (in some ways) anticipatory of Austin and his generation. Wittgenstein does not have what one might call, in tenet-listing form, "a philosophy of music", but as Szabados shows throughout this study he does have what one might call a way of seeing music within the expanded field of a culture. And that way of seeing, in contrast to a more philosophically customary thesis-itemizing position, brings entirely new light into the field. To state a somewhat complex methodological matter briefly: this book shows how much is lost by ignoring Wittgenstein's approach because it does not deliver thesis-statements or conform to pre-identified categories.

Szabados writes: "The importance of cultural context and tradition -- whether understanding a person, a language or a work of art -- is a basic premise in Wittgenstein's mature philosophical perspective" (p. 39). A musical work seen in its cultural context, a work heard imaginatively within its tradition and its meaning-determining set of precedents, the informative parallel between understanding a person and understanding a composition, the range of comprehension required to understand a language as analogous to the range required to understand a work of music -- these are all investigated here, and what one leaves the book with is, fittingly to its central subject, more a way of seeing how a work of music emerges, how it interrelates, how it functions in a human life, how it both displays and cultivates a sensibility than a reduced set of propositions foundational to the construction of a musical aesthetic. In his lectures on aesthetics Wittgenstein said: "To describe appreciation you have to describe a whole culture" (p. 39), and this book is among the rare contributions to the field that seem to deeply understand that point.

Szabados provides an elegant and incisive discussion of the relations between Hanslick's strict formalism and the views of the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, and he here insightfully brings in the always interesting influence on the younger Wittgenstein of Schopenhauer. But it is the middle to later work of Wittgenstein's that provides the richest rewards here. We see him in a lecture observing that we hardly ever hear the word "beauty" in our engagements with the arts -- except in aesthetics classes (p. 60-61). We see the relevance of Wittgenstein's opposition, not at all to science, but to scientism as a misleading influence on our aesthetic thought (p.63). We see him operating against the Platonic presuppositions of essentialism (and they are shown here to be manifest to an extent in Hanslick) and the way that overgeneralization (e.g. "music is a language") can cast important and instructive particularities in darkness and dull our discernment (p. 68-71). But there is something a reader might wish Szabados had also done (particularly because, as one sees in this book, Szabados might be singularly good at it): Szabados quotes Wittgenstein's remark about his friend and great philosophical colleague Frank Ramsey:

He truly relished music and with understanding. And one could see by looking at him what effect it had on him. Of the last movement of one of Beethoven's late quartets, a movement he loved perhaps more than anything else, he told me that it made him feel as if the heavens were open. And that meant something when he said it. (p. 70)

And that meant something when he said it: there is here an opening to bring out in higher relief the element of Wittgenstein's philosophy of language that concerns the difference between the meanings of words and the meanings of a person's words, and then to assess the significance of that difference for our understanding of and involvement with music. But then to undertake that might have lengthened the book by half. Szabados does show how Wittgenstein repeatedly puts side-by-side linguistic and musical questions, such as asking, in the context of music, "What is it to hear a sentence or a word with understanding?" (p. 81). And Szabados certainly strongly intimates what I am calling for, by showing in impressive detail the gulf between the strict variety of formalism mentioned above (where only structural relations internal to the work are recognized as determinative of its content and meaning) and Wittgenstein's ability to see all that -- but also much, much more. Szabados richly explicates Wittgenstein remark, "I think that in order to enjoy a poet, you have to like the culture to which he belongs as well" (p. 83). That is, Szabados is emphasizing precisely the meaning-generating cultural resonances (p. 83) that lie beyond the reach of formalism, and these resonances function as the culture-wide analogues to the personal resonances that we may need to quite exactingly discern and define in order to truly understand a person's words ("And that meant something when he said it") as uttered about their life or as uttered about their experience of a musical work.

Szabados sees deeply into an issue that weaves itself throughout this eye-opening study: he captures this issue succinctly in the sentence "As he [Wittgenstein] connects music to language, gesture, argument and the human face, the intractable traditional problems seem to melt away" (p. 84). That is, what I have said above concerning the alternative way of seeing music and musical experience that Wittgenstein offers ("alternative", for one reason, because it does not take on established narrowly-focused problems such as expressive properties, representation, identity conditions, definition, or ontology) captures only part of what we find here. Szabados, by developing this theme intermittently and then addressing it directly in a final chapter, shows through a kind of incremental conceptual movement that the view Wittgenstein offers is related to those problems -- if often only by supplanting them, unearthing their presuppositions, or in a sense enlarging their scope beyond their survival in their previous independently-chiseled form (hence his metaphor "melt away").

We are also reminded that the family-resemblance metaphor can prove of considerable help in thinking about musical as well as linguistic matters: We might ask ourselves a question such as "What is melody, essentially?", where the general form of the question simultaneously dulls acuity and marginalizes particularity as mentioned above. Wittgenstein commented, "The melodies of different composers can be approached by applying the principle: Every species of tree is a 'tree' in a different sense of the word. I.e. Don't let yourself be misled by our saying they are all melodies" (p. 88). This can indeed seem a turn away from a traditional musical-aesthetic question ("What is a melody?"), but (and perhaps Szabados should have made this point more forcefully) it is not. Rather, it is an answer, but of a different kind from the one we may have expected (i.e. as singular essence-defining), considering a range of examples that show what they are, where we would draw lines (e.g. where a horizontal musical line is the top line of harmonies but not functioning as a melody), and how they play different roles in different musical contexts. And here there emerges one particularly powerful instance of Szabados' distinctive approach to the larger topic of Wittgenstein on music as mentioned at the outset: he observes that Wittgenstein's profoundly serious involvement with and deep understanding of music, as shown here in his remark about melodies and the differing senses of the same word "tree", played a definite role in the development of his philosophy of language (p. 89). Language itself, for Wittgenstein, was not hermetically or formalistically sealed off from culture. And of the two-way street between music and language, Szabados writes, "Music is not alone, as formalists suggest: it resonates with the whole field of our language games -- with our other musical and cultural practices" (p. 92). But then this claim, as he shows, requires philosophical care; there is a wrong turn here that it is very easy to take.

Wittgenstein writes of a work of music,

The impression it makes on me is connected with things in its surroundings -- e.g. with the existence of the German language and of its intonation, but that means with the whole field of our language games. If I say e.g.: it's as if here a conclusion were being drawn, or, as if here something were being confirmed, or, as if this were a reply to what came earlier, -- then, the way I understand it clearly presupposes familiarity with conclusions, confirmations, replies, etc.

Szabados blocks the wrong turn by focusing on the use here of the repeated "as if" phrases: The "as if" prevents the equation of the meaning of a musical theme with "the meaning of a statement or assertion" (p. 106). That is, it has meaning by resonating with "our language, ways of life, and social practices" (p. 106). And then, like language (particularly but certainly not only in cases of repetition, quotation, and phrase-adaptation), the musical phrase can acquire meaning by resonating with "the conventions and history of music itself" (p. 106). Once having taken the wrong turn, we will ask, and expect an answer to (and will not be conceptually satisfied without), what the verbally-articulated content of the conclusion, the confirmation, or the reply is. And precisely there, inattentive to the "as-if" meaning-generating relation, we collapse (and often unwittingly so) the analogy between music and language to a relation of identity or equivalence -- thus condemning ourselves to questions that are as unanswerable as they are misbegotten. By contrast, an awareness of the analogical relation or resonance -- a heeding of Szabados' Wittgensteinian warning -- frees us to take the "as-if" description as what it actually is -- the very articulation of the meaning-content for which we were otherwise seeking.

But the matter does not end there. There are striking moments in this book where the kind of analogical understanding just described starts in our language and social practices, carries over to our understanding of music and how we hear a given passage, and then travels back again not to language but to the understanding of Wittgenstein's larger philosophical project itself. Of musical counterpoint, Szabados writes,

counterpoint basically involves the interweaving of independent voices or melodic lines that contribute to the emerging polyphony, which, in turn, enhances and comments on the individual voices. If so, then counterpoint offers us a key to understanding the structure and style of the Investigations as a matter of different voices within a dialogue sketching conflicting philosophical views and aiming at their dissolution by doing justice to each (p. 119).

And Szabados sees interesting particularized connections under this heading: of Schubert's later-in-life return to the study of counterpoint, he suggests that what Schubert really desired, rather than to just augment his technique, was to know where he stood in relation to the tradition and art of contrapuntal composition, and that Schubert's project stands in an illuminating parallel with Wittgenstein's desire to know, to find out -- I would say to work out -- where he stood in relation to a complex weave of dissonant voices without adopting any one dogmatically. This contrapuntal model would also I think help articulate why it is usually misguided to try to extract codified conventional philosophical positions ("Wittgenstein's position" on x, y, or z -- the analogy to a single straightforward musical theme) in a way insufficiently attentive to or aware of the conceptually therapeutic dimension of his work and methodological approach.

One more thing: with the ground he has covered behind him, Szabados is in a position late in this book to offer a clear and powerful explanation of why Wittgenstein was as vehemently opposed -- or I would say perhaps closed to as a matter of sensibility -- to the developments around him in modern musical composition as his philosophical writings, notebooks, and conversations show him to have been. If Szabados, following Wittgenstein, is right, then music as Szabados says "shows us our shared forms of life, the grounds and origins of associated language games which are their refinement: musical gestures of dirge, of mourning, of prayer, or worship, of celebration, of violence and war, of coronation, of contemplation and so on". And these would thus be "expressive of basic central moments of our lives as human beings" (p. 127). All the interconnections so far considered contrapuntally interweaving language, music, and life are in play here. And because Wittgenstein was unable to hear, to sense or to feel, and to make those humane interconnections to the Modernist compositional idiom, he found it alien. Mahler, for him, was the turning point, and so Strauss, Schönberg, Bartók and others were all composing in a way that seemed to him hermetic, anemically autonomous, and in a meaning-draining way, formalist.

This links to another insight, one well worth contemplating: Szabados sees any such attempt to reductively capture or define an essence of musical coherence and meaning-content as a direct aesthetic parallel to Wittgenstein's "rejection of the formalist approach in the philosophy of language" (p. 130) in his later work. That is, for reasons perfectly parallel to the situation with music, "formalist attempts to grasp the meanings of words and propositions fail" (p. 130). And this in turn is connected back to the previous consideration of melody and what it is -- or what different kinds of things they can be. After the previous remark, Wittgenstein writes, "If you simply look at the sequences of notes and the changes of key, all these structures no doubt appear on the same level" (p.133). That is, if one looks, from a conventional and over-general way of seeing the issue from a very high altitude, things do look the same and generalities seem plausible. But Wittgenstein next makes a remark indicative of his approach and one that is in fact emblematic of the entire approach taken in Szabados' conceptually reorienting book: "But if you look at the field of force in which they stand (and hence their significance), you will be inclined to say: Here melody is something quite different than there (here it has a different origin, plays a different role, inter alia)" (p. 133). The field of force, the significance, the language-game, the cultural resonance, the harmonic setting, the rhythmic definition and time signature, the analogy to verbal phrasing and locution, the "as-if" relations, the contrapuntal logic, the form of life: all of these phrases themselves resonate with each other, and Szabados' beautiful book -- a remarkable contribution to our understanding of music in civilization -- itself creates an environment in which we as readers are enabled to hear and make those enriching interconnections.