Wittgenstein at His Word

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Duncan Richter, Wittgenstein at His Word, Continuum, 2004, 220pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 082647473X.

Reviewed by Frederick Stoutland, Uppsala University


Wittgenstein at His Word is an account of how Wittgenstein's notion of the aim and value of philosophy shaped his philosophical method and the issues he dealt with in his writings. Richter's view is that Wittgenstein did not, as "orthodox traditional interpretations" maintain, put forward philosophical theories and argue for them but presented a therapeutic method "not to answer philosopher's questions but to lead his readers to see that what seemed to be questions are really nothing but nonsense."[2] The goal "is conceptual or intellectual clarity and nothing else,"[4] although clarity has "an important ethical or spiritual aspect"[3] the grasp of which can help us understand his work. What clarity drives out is confusion, which is an "existential problem": "the philosophically confused individual is a victim of his or her culture, perverted by language."[5]

The book has five chapters. The first ("Confusion") is a general discussion of Wittgenstein's view of philosophy and the confusion he aims to dispel: whatever prevents us from seeing the facts or acknowledging "all we want to acknowledge."[39] The second ("Nonsense") considers language and rules, giving an account of Wittgenstein on private language that contends that his aim is "not to show that a private language is impossible … but that certain things one might want to say about language are ultimately incoherent."[60] It also discusses the role of nonsense in the Tractatus and Philosophical Investigations and surveys the debate between the Conant-Diamond and the Hacker views of whether there is important nonsense, unfortunately wavering between the two interpretations. The third ("Certainty") discusses "the sense in which grammar is not arbitrary, in which there is some foundation to our use of language, including our use of such important concepts as truth."[112] In the fourth Richter gives an account of Wittgenstein's view of ethics: "Ethics, in the sense of moral philosophy is impossible [but] ethics in the sense of morality … seems to be unavoidable." Although, on the one hand, Wittgenstein's philosophy has ethical goals, it is not "bound to be biased" because of them, while, on the other, philosophy "in itself has nothing to say."[145] Chapter Five takes the same line on religion: although Wittgenstein sees every problem "from a religious point of view," his philosophy "could not support or destroy religious faith." He is, therefore, a fideist, although "properly understood," this is not the "embarrassment" his critics claim. [150]

Richter's book is smoothly written, draws usefully on a wide variety of secondary sources, and offers an interesting and novel account of the structure of Wittgenstein's writing (which I discuss below). A virtue of the book is its placing Wittgenstein's work in the setting of his personal views about culture and value. Another is the range of issues it articulates. What is the point of Wittgenstein's therapeutic method? Does his work on language presuppose the kind of theory he rejects? Does his insistence on description make him an ordinary-language philosopher? Is he a foundationalist in some sense? What is the significance of his claim that a genuine thesis in philosophy would be a truism? These are good questions that merit explicit discussion, and Richter's reflections on them draw attention to relevant considerations and helpful quotations. Those relatively new to Wittgenstein may find the book useful as an orientation to his work, and others may be stimulated by the questions it raises and its exploration of Wittgenstein's remarks on ethics and religion.

Although Richter's intention is "to say what Wittgenstein's work means" and not to defend it, he shows himself as committed to doing philosophy in the therapeutic manner. I agree that we should reject the "orthodox traditional" claim that Wittgenstein's aim is to construct philosophical theories, but I do not agree with what Richter presents as an alternative, which is the philosopher conceived literally as a therapist who listens and makes suggestions on what one can do intellectually for oneself to achieve a "healthy soul."[38] Richter's defense of this as an interpretation of Wittgenstein is not persuasive, and the therapeutic Wittgenstein that he presents is philosophically unattractive.

Richter's work has, in my view, a number of shortcomings. His handling of Wittgenstein's extra-philosophical remarks about cultural and spiritual matters is not very penetrating and tends toward the prosaic. Although it is good to have discussions of alternative interpretations of key concepts, they are much less useful than they might have been because he often refuses to take a stand of his own and thus obscures the overall picture. His philosophical discussions are not deep or well argued, partly because of the large number of topics he discusses, but partly because he is careless, especially in drawing distinctions that are too often imprecise and shifting. It is not a book that will persuade philosophers not already committed to a therapeutic reading of Wittgenstein's work but will alienate them further. Nor will it be very illuminating to philosophers who are sympathetic to that reading but insist that the problems of philosophy are deep and intricate, involve nonsense only when pushed in certain directions, and are capable of resolution only with great care and precision and with attentiveness to the arguments that surround them.

Since I cannot give a detailed critique of such a wide-ranging book, I will focus on its most novel claim, namely, that Wittgenstein's writings manifest three personae. One is the "personal Wittgenstein" who expresses purely personal views that strike many as "seemingly crazy"[117]. The second is the "philosophical-methodological Wittgenstein", the therapeutic philosopher whose aim is to eliminate confusion and uncover nonsense, and for whom the only legitimate assertions are "boring truisms." The third is the "suspicious-metaphysical Wittgenstein" who has theoretical beliefs that are debated by philosophers who think Wittgenstein proposed his own theories of language, mind, and so on. For Richter these theoretical beliefs are only in the background because, on his construal of Wittgenstein's philosophical method, philosophy cannot discuss them. He calls them "guiding suspicions" because he thinks they guide Wittgenstein in choosing problems and using his method to dissolve them.

Richter's use of this trichotomy is clearest in his consideration of Wittgenstein's account of ethics and religion. As he notes, Wittgenstein claimed "to see every problem from a religious point of view and did not distinguish sharply between the ethical and the religious."[120] The difficulty is to discern what Wittgenstein meant by the ethical and the religious and how they relate to his philosophical work. Although Wittgenstein wrote rather little on these matters, Richter thinks use of the trichotomy can meld what he did write into a consistent account.

For Wittgenstein's "purely personal" views, Richter cites writing like that collected in Culture and Value and comments by Wittgenstein's friends, taking his views to be "idiosyncratic" (I would say "ironic"), but "compatible with sanity, and even a fairly traditional romanticism [similar to] Christian writers like Betjman and G. K. Chesterton."[124] The crucial point for Richter is that these ethical views not be taken as binding in any sense. "The Wittgensteinian approach is to look and think and wonder, and do what one's conscience dictates" no matter where that leads since "there is no more to be said."[128] He holds a similar view about Wittgenstein's personal views on religion: "Say what you choose [which will] surely vary from one individual to another."[162]

The "methodological Wittgenstein" will neither attack nor defend such personal views, since his philosophical method yields only claims everyone would accept. The method aims to eliminate confusion in one's ethical or religious beliefs but, Richter contends, if an individual is not personally convinced that she is confused, she may simply go on as before. If she does so after considering all the facts, then probably she does not have "a philosophical theory but more a kind of religious belief, and Wittgenstein is not out to attack that."[130] There is, therefore, no place for moral philosophy or for theology or philosophy of religion as traditionally practiced.

The "suspicious metaphysical Wittgenstein" is more obscure. He would be "suspicious of any and all ethical theories" (and theological ones), but "he might be more sympathetic to communitarian ideas than Platonist ones … ." Moreover, he would not simply oppose a moral (or theological) theory because "he opposes confusion, after all, not any particular doctrine … . It all depends on what use [the doctrine] is given".[131] Natural law theory might be acceptable "at least if the believer is Catholic … . and Kantian deontology might be all right for Pietists."[132] The point seems to be that although neither the methodological nor the suspicious Wittgenstein can argue for or against such theories, an individual can defend (or attack) them by appeal to personal ethical or religious views, a defense (or attack) that does not, however, extend to those who do not share those views.

Is the satisfaction that serial killers gain from their crime intrinsically good, bad, or neither? It seems bad to me, but I suppose some utilitarians will consider it good. Will they still say it is good after they have really thought about it seriously? I cannot say. The philosopher as individual or as philosopher cannot speak for others on ethical matters.

A similar point holds for religion.

Every practice or belief is immune from criticism when one sticks to a method that allows only those assertions that are accepted by the practitioner or believer herself. And this is Wittgenstein's method in philosophy.[170] A person's religious beliefs might be infected with philosophical confusion, but if so, all the true Wittgensteinian can do is offer helpful remarks and see whether these are accepted. Most likely they will not be, unless the individual in question feels confused.[177]

The motivation for this general approach to Wittgenstein's writing is understandable, and perhaps it is preferable to construing it as underargued philosophical theory-construction that has to be extended and corrected. But it is unacceptable in that it distorts his work, ascribes to him a confused and even silly subjectivism, and fails to show why he is, as Richter agrees, a great philosopher.

One objection is that it makes no distinction between writing Wittgenstein agreed to have published, writing he reworked but did not publish, writing he rejected, and notes and jottings he made only for himself. To take "Wittgenstein at his word" cannot mean to take all his writing with equal seriousness and attempt to make it internally consistent even while interpreting it quite literally. Understanding his views may require reading his unpublished work, but the criterion for claims about what are his considered views lies in what he published, not in his notes or other work he did not want to publish.

Wittgenstein did publish the remark that "If one tried to advance theses in philosophy, it would never be possible to debate them because everyone would agree to them."[Investigations, 128] Richter takes this to define the philosophical, therapeutic Wittgenstein, arguing that any claim to which someone would dissent can be no part of philosophy in Wittgenstein's sense. He asserts that this is "not very different from the standard philosophical approach of starting with a common intuition, [although] Wittgenstein might be more rigorous than most about choosing intuitions that are universally, not just widely, shared."[130] Hence philosophy cannot defend or attack any substantive claims; it has no normative status because what is acceptable in therapy is just what the patient herself is able to accept.

The problem is that there are in the philosophical writings Wittgenstein published many substantive claims that are both controversial and integral to his work. He never used what "everyone would agree to" as defining what is philosophical but (I would suggest) as an ideal at which philosophers should aim but that is seldom met even by himself. Moreover, such truisms would be pointless unless seen as the outcome of rigorous work centered on philosophical problems. The latter are non-trivial, have "the character of depth", and rest on assumptions often unnoticed but understandably widely shared and difficult to shake. Wittgenstein thinks they are distinct from other kinds of problems and are more to be dissolved than solved, but it is thoroughly misleading to say that on his view "philosophy is the study of problems that are not real."[120]

By what "everyone would agree to" Wittgenstein means nothing like "the standard philosophical approach of starting with a common intuition." On the contrary, such intuitions typically mirror the assumptions he would have us give up and that keep us from seeing what are "most important for us [and] are hidden because of their simplicity and familiarity."[Investigations, 126] Characterizing what everyone would agree to in Wittgenstein's sense requires extraordinary effort and is not the beginning but the end of philosophy.

Richter recognizes that philosophical theories play an important role in Wittgenstein's writing, but he thinks they belong to the suspicious-metaphysical Wittgenstein and merely hover in the background of his philosophical work. They have a role because Wittgenstein's method presupposes both "negative theories about the wrongness of other people's ideas"[7] and positive theories on which his method depends.[23] Richter tries to reconcile this with Wittgenstein's rejection of philosophical theories by arguing that Wittgenstein "never explicitly articulates his guiding ideas and … he does not insist or try to prove that his 'theories' are correct."[7]

This division between two Wittgensteins drains his work of much philosophical interest. One reason Richter gives for this division is that Wittgenstein was sympathetic to traditional philosophers like Plato or Descartes in ways that critics of philosophical theories find hard to understand. But if all that is meant by a philosopher's defending a theory is that he should articulate his view clearly and coherently, spell out arguments against alternatives and reasons in support of his own, and give explanations that elucidate or clarify matters, then any good philosopher, including Wittgenstein, is in the business of defending a theory. Traditional philosophers like Plato or Descartes were, however, in the theory business in a stronger sense because they articulated theories that went beyond elucidation to explanation of why phenomena occurred. But they did not make a distinction between philosophical and scientific theories, and from our vantage point their explanatory theories were mostly scientific, and what we would regard as philosophical theories are relatively rare. Wittgenstein admired them less for their theories than for their acute observations and for the way they reflected their cultural and spiritual milieu. He was, of course, severely critical of many philosophical theories, Russell's, for instance, whose philosophical views he could scorn, or Frege's, whose views he criticized respectfully and subtly. Such criticism is central to the hard work Wittgenstein took philosophy to involve, and its target is not mere background theories for such work.

Wittgenstein's criticism of philosophical theories was not (intended to be) based on a philosophical theory of his own nor does his "methodology" depend upon one. Consider the so-called "context principle", expressed thus in the Tractatus: "Only the proposition has sense; only in the context of a proposition has a name meaning." [3.3 in Ogden's translation] This is particularly relevant because, while it is fundamental to Wittgenstein's conception of language (early and late), Richter never mentions it. Wittgenstein learned it from Frege who gave a version of it a place in his theory of language, and it or its denial has played a central role in many theories. Wittgenstein thought it could be disentangled from philosophical theories and elucidated through the use of examples in such as way as to convince anyone who was not already wedded to a philosophical theory of language or mind that made it controversial. The philosophical work, therefore, was not to defend it but to undermine theoretical assumptions that made it dubious.

Wittgenstein did not use the therapeutic metaphor to suggest that philosophy licenses persons "to say what they choose"[139]. He wrote in the Investigations that his hope for the book was that it could "if possible, stimulate someone to thoughts of his own", but that did not mean that whatever one comes to accept is acceptable. It means that one might take Wittgenstein as a model for how to do philosophy but not as a model for what to believe. The former is an arduous task and, as Richter's book manifests, it is extremely difficult to say what Wittgenstein's way of doing philosophy was. While it is useful to try, it is better to show it in work of one's own, not as an acolyte but as an engaged philosopher who strives to resolve problems, not by constructing more and more elaborate explanatory theories, but by criticizing the assumptions that give rise to them and arranging in an illuminating way what we have, in some sense, always known.