Wittgenstein: Biography and Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Klagge, James C., ed., Wittgenstein: Biography and Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 272 pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-00868-9.

Reviewed by Juliet Floyd, Boston University


Wittgenstein’s person, like his philosophy, arouses powerful feelings, positive and negative; any effort to establish a narrative doing justice to the complexity and intensity of the facts of his life inevitably runs the risk of appearing suspiciously cultish to professional philosophers, as if a substitute for critical engagement with the philosophy. But the philosophy grew from the life, and the life was lived in the face of singular internal and external pressures. Philosophy was for him a way to expose the places where vanity, received authority, unclarity and lack of resolve blunted his powers of expression, making him dishonest with others and himself. His difficulties were thus the kind of difficulties we all face one by one as we inherit a language, and it is one of his great intellectual contributions to have made this struggle worthy of the name of philosophy.

It is thus not surprising to learn that he wrote in his diary (in 1931) that “the movement of thought (Denkbewegung) in my philosophy should be discernible in the history of my mind (Geistes), of its moral concepts and in the understanding of my situation”; as Joachim Schulte stresses in his essay, Wittgenstein always took the content of what he wrote to be shaped by the spirit, means and manner in which it was expressed. The presupposition of this anthology is that Wittgenstein’s life and his philosophy have a distinctive kind of internal connection, that the body of the work is ethical in a broad sense of the term. Since some of the most interesting and controversial recent writing about Wittgenstein has argued that his investigations in logic are simultaneously investigations in ethics, the anthology addresses timely themes. The authors do not approach this issue from a single viewpoint, however. This is a strength of the volume, as I see it. If Wittgenstein had one thing to teach philosophers, it is the importance of learning to allow complexity to live free and clear, doing it justice by not glossing it over with a falsely unifying doctrine.

In his introduction James Klagge explores some of the alternative ways we might understand Wittgenstein’s dying words to his friends, “Tell them I had a wonderful life” (caustically, as an expression of happiness or acceptance, a kind of praise of wonder at life, and so on). Here Klagge takes “philosophy” in the ancient sense, as an expression of a way of life and a preparation for death. Not all the contributors take up this point of view, though James Conant addresses in part the question of how illuminating a parallel between Socrates’ and Wittgenstein’s ways of living and thinking might be. He and Ray Monk contribute useful pieces on the very idea of philosophical biography, jointly defending Monk’s biographical method in his books on Wittgenstein and Russell, a method which aims to set forth particular facts about a philosopher’s life in such a way that an overarching picture of the philosophy as one lived by a particular human being emerges to speak for itself, without the help of an overarching theory (in The Duty of Genius Monk does not attempt to interpret Wittgenstein’s last words). This is Wittgensteinian biographical method, as opposed to a didactic or analytical or historicist or psychologistic biographical method, and it is a measure of the philosophical unity of Wittgenstein’s life and thought that the method, applied to his life, is as illuminating as it is.

Several essays broach the issue of how we are to understand the above-quoted remark of Wittgenstein’s about the movement of his thought, a remark culled from an entry in Wittgenstein’s so-called “Koder Diaries”, a fascinating collection from the years 1930-32 and 1936-37 recently published in the volume Denkbewegung, ed. Somavilla (Haymon Verlag, 1997). Alfred Nordmann’s thoughtful essay warns against the naïve use of Wittgenstein’s diaries as a kind of magical key to the unlocking of his thought, while arguing that the kind of spiritual exercises Wittgenstein works through in them exemplify his philosophical methods. Nordmann also poses the important question of whether the religious rhetoric Wittgenstein invokes in his diary writing of the 1930’s ought to be taken to express a commitment to a something-that-cannot-be-said. These remarks should be compared with those in Wittgenstein’s coded diaries from the First World War (Geheime Tagebücher, eds. Baum and Albert, Turia and Kant 1991). Some have interpreted Wittgenstein’s prayers and remarks about his struggles to believe in the Spirit as a straightforward profession of (Christian) belief in the transcendent. I take them to reflect his distinctive way of trying authentically to absorb certain pieces of religious and philosophical language he inherited from the culture and his family. You might say that that is all any religious believer ever does; but Wittgenstein did not affiliate himself in practice with any particular religious community. His situation was peculiar, not merely philosophically, but also culturally and historically, because he was raised as a Catholic, descended from converted Jewish grandparents, in a very prominent fin-de-siècle Viennese family that was widely perceived as in some sense Jewish. His was a life lived utterly outside the shadows of any orthodoxy, any deference to outside authority, any standing affiliation with a particular religious community. In his diaries, Christian terms are wrenched from him nearly instinctively, but never assertorically, always problematically, in the face of his recurrent crises of confidence. His diaries from the First World War were composed in unbelievably dire, existentially limiting conditions, surrounded by death and killing. The diaries from the 1930’s were composed in crises years, years during which Wittgenstein turned forty, decided not to marry, emigrated, faced the impact of his decision to earn a philosophical living by his own hand, meditated on his Jewishness, reacted to the reception of his early work, and the work of Moore, Russell, Brouwer, Ramsey, Hilbert, Turing, Frazer, and the Vienna Circle, and tried to come to terms with his own internal philosophical drive, struggling to clarify and make habitable the philosophical place he had reached by the end of the First World War. For me it is important that Wittgenstein’s remark about his Denkbewegung is preceded by a sentence that concerns his brother Kurt, who had killed himself in 1918. It reads: “I understand completely the state of mind of my brother Kurt. He was only just a grade sleepier than I.” Suicide—the question of the value of life as such—was an ever-present specter for him, not merely a theoretical possibility. But it was philosophy, rather than Christianity, that helped him to cope with it.

Beyond the diaries, other previously inaccessible materials about Wittgenstein’s life have continued to emerge in recent years. His complete philosophical Nachlass is available on CD-Rom (Oxford University Press, 2000). Frege’s letters to Wittgenstein about the Tractatus, discovered in the mid-1980’s, appeared in Im Brennpunkt Wittgenstein, eds. McGuinness and Haller (Rodopi, 1989--forthcoming English translation in Festschrift for G.H. von Wright, eds. DePellegrin and Hintikka), and there are more letters in Ludwig Hänsel-Ludwig Wittgenstein: Eine Freundschaft, eds. Somavilla, Unterkirchner and Berger (Haymon, 1994), the new edition of Ludwig Wittgenstein: Cambridge Letters, eds. McGuinness and von Wright (Blackwell, 1995), and in Wittgenstein: Familienbriefe, eds. McGuinness, Ascher, Pfersmann (Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky, 1996). The interpretive challenge for those who write on Wittgenstein and biography in the future will be to see how to weigh these previously unscrutinized materials in assessing his philosophy and the influence of his life on it. This collection mostly focuses on the Koder Diaries.

Kelly Hamilton’s essay is the only one to lay out previously unknown details about Wittgenstein’s life. She explains the engineering curriculum Wittgenstein followed as a student at the Technische Hochschule in Charlottenburg 1906-1908, stressing the importance of Wittgenstein’s study of descriptive geometry and engineering design at the Berlin school and exploring in detail the history of engineering-education theory that shaped the curriculum he followed (it was hands-on, involving much drawing and constructing). She then argues that the Notebooks 1914-1916 and Tractatus passages on picturing ought to be read as reflecting Wittgenstein’s imbibement through this study of a distinctive kind of visual, non-verbal, synthetic, constructive thinking. This raises a host of interesting questions about how we are to approach Wittgenstein’s picturing idea. Hamilton takes his habits of mind to be reflected in the idea of showing, but she does not insist that this is the exclusive way to understand Wittgenstein’s use of it; she explicitly notes the impact of Hertz on Wittgenstein as well. To this must be added the importance of the intellectual milieu Wittgenstein sought and encountered at Manchester, where, as Susan Sterrett has shown, Osborne Reynolds’ work on scale models and the problems of their use in predicting the behavior of large-scale systems, along with Horace Lamb’s theoretical book on hydrodynamics, were helping to bring together a way of understanding how the form of an equation could establish a similarity between a scale model and thing modeled useful for solving problems of machine flight (Institute of the Vienna Circle Yearbook, 2001, eds. Heidelberger and Stadler). I have observed that the Tractatus passages on mathematics strikingly echo passages on the algebraic use of equations to solve problems of applied mathematics in Whitehead’s 1898 Treatise on Universal Algebra (see my essay in Floyd and Shieh, eds., Future Pasts: The Analytic Tradition in Twentieth-Century Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 2001)). This trend of placing Wittgenstein’s thought within the history of applied mathematics is to be welcomed, for it makes the point that his anti-scientism sprang neither from willful ignorance nor from an unadulterated mysticism, and also sheds positive light on his attitude toward the importance and nature of mathematical modeling. It also suggests that we root a most powerful aspect of Wittgenstein’s whole way of thinking—his knack for imaginative model-building to picture philosophical turns of thought, and his sensitivity to the difficulties we face in applying such pictures—in his life. Of course the suggestion does not undercut observations made by scholars such as McGuinness that the picturing idea ought not to be seen as the crux of Wittgenstein’s early thinking about logic and language. Nor does it solve or explain away the debate between Cora Diamond and Peter Hacker (and others) over whether the show/say distinction amounts to an unstable form of mysticism about ineffability. But it makes the context of this debate richer and more complex.

One reason that Wittgenstein scholarship has always had an especially harrowing and at the same time hallowing relation to biographical details of the philosopher’s life is that part of the fascination of the man comes from the dramatic setting in which his life unfolded in fin-de-siècle Vienna, Manchester and Trinity College Cambridge, Jena, the First and Second World Wars, Lower Austria, Norway, the United States and Ireland. Any emphasis upon the biographical, cultural and social facts thus runs the risk of overwhelming the spirit of the philosophy, burying it in a theory of history or psychology. A recurring, Hegelian sense of Wittgenstein as a kind of cipher reflecting essential features of twentieth century history and culture has led some to use certain facts about his life as a springboard for preposterous claims about twentieth century history—I think of Kimberley Cornish’s The Jew Of Linz, which sees the ideology of National Socialism as the natural inheritance of Wittgenstein’s supposed “mental socialism”, the clash between Hitler and Stalin as the indirect outcome of a boyhood encounter between Hitler and Wittgenstein at Realschule, and Wittgenstein’s Tolstoyian notion of emigration to Russia in the 1930’s as the activities of a master Cambridge spy. The Klagge anthology will, I hope, help to curb such hopelessly coarse and inaccurate mischaracterizations of Wittgenstein’s life. A much more careful and well-informed interpretation of Wittgenstein as a cultural cipher is Louis Sass’s essay, which brings to bear a clinician’s point of view on Wittgenstein. Sass argues that the “schizoid”, paradoxical and self-rounding qualities of Wittgenstein’s work exemplify a distinctively modern dislocation of the self in its world, and that this clinical perspective helps to explain some of the hold Wittgenstein’s writings have on us. This rather un-Wittgensteinian treatment of Wittgenstein depicts him as an exceptionally sensitive, creatively perceptive, yet disrupted soul. Sass’s essay should be compared and contrasted with Sylvia Nasar’s recent biography of John Nash, A Beautiful Mind, which documents the actual, much more debilitating paranoid schizophrenia of a mathematician living in a much less personally harrowing set of historical circumstances. Something of the same intellectual intensity, heroism and purity colors these very different lives, though we see in the tales of their struggles how much more solid a grip on himself and others Wittgenstein was able to achieve, and largely through his philosophizing.

One good reason to study a philosopher’s life in earnest is to develop some judgment about what does and does not stand in character for that thinker, and to realize that even the greatest, most humane philosophers may make judgments that we regard as disturbingly lame, though in no way dictated by the overall thrust of what is best in their philosophy. There is no use valorizing where valorizing isn’t due. I think here of Kant’s racism, Schopenhauer’s misogyny, and of Frege’s political writings. In Wittgenstein’s case, we face his youthful stance against women’s suffrage, his enthusiasm for Weininger, and his investigation of classic anti-semitic metaphors in his 1930’s diary remarks about “the Jewish mind”. Hans-Johann Glock’s essay treats the cultural and political judgments of Wittgenstein’s which strike us as having been “off” as expressions of what he calls Wittgenstein’s “anti-intellectual”, “irrationalist” tendencies. On Glock’s view, Wittgenstein the man was “ambivalent” about reason, but Wittgenstein the philosopher was committed to a certain form of critical rationalism. The aim of his essay is to save Wittgenstein from the pit of “irrationalism” that Glock fears his philosophy is hurled into by readers like Drury, Diamond, Bouwsma and Rorty. Glock claims, in particular, that Wittgenstein’s show/say distinction and his later analogies between therapy and philosophy, celebrated in different ways by each of these readers, are “irrationalist”. This is odd, since Wittgenstein’s recurrent analogy between seeing and understanding grows naturally from our language itself, and is employed throughout his life as part and parcel of his logical and ethical investigations, not as a side-doctrine that could be exorcised without loss. Indeed, what seems most important to learn from his uses of the analogy is a certain scepticism about there being a core notion of Reason universally applicable to all branches of knowledge in the same way. “Reason”, we might say, is not a concept-word for Wittgenstein; it doesn’t behave in the ways that we might at first expect it to. This view, like Hume’s or the later Rawls’s, is hardly “irrational”; it is eminently reasonable, passionately realistic, more naturally applicable to ethics and mathematics than one might think, and constitutes a serious response to the Kantian tradition Glock tries to invoke on behalf of Wittgenstein.

A more compelling explanation for (what most of us take to be) Wittgenstein’s lapses of judgment would grow from an investigation of the culture in which he was raised; Glock himself offers a useful gloss on Weininger’s “metaphysical” anti-semitism, explaining how it grew out of Schopenhauer’s philosophy, an index of its cultural deep-rootedness in the minds and hearts of so many German speakers. Two final essays in the volume, by Brian McGuinness and David Stern, directly grapple with the difficult question of Wittgenstein and Jewishness. Some of Wittgenstein’s diary remarks on the topic—especially those from the early 1930’s—are, to use Ray Monk’s apt word, “shocking”, and require the utmost sensitivity and judgment to be rightly understood and discussed. Otherwise, as McGuinness warns, one may nourish certain confused ideas by airing the topic. But air it we must, if we are interested in Wittgenstein’s biography. It is not a negligible part of intellectual history that one of the greatest twentieth century philosophers seriously occupied himself with the notion of the Jews (among whom he at times counted himself) as a foreign body or tumor on the body of Austria, or the nature of the Jew as a cunning, secretive, cowardly and unoriginal soul. McGuinness argues—polemically—that “in the end, then, Wittgenstein did not think of himself as Jewish, nor need we do so”, but his grounds for this make it sound, oddly, as if we could accept this as all that there is to say in the end, as a matter of objective fact. He writes, of Wittgenstein’s converted grandparents, that “Jewishness as a family characteristic vanished on conversion and intermarriage”—as if people lost their interest in backgrounds or noses or cultural stereotypes once a family was converted—and that rather than speaking of “assimilation” we might better think of the “evaporation” of Jewishness in Wittgenstein’s family. Yet, as both McGuinness and Stern say, the question “Was Wittgenstein Jewish?” is ill-posed, inviting a Yes-No answer where there is none; the notion of what “being Jewish” really means is not just unclear, but vexed and fraught. The important point is that Wittgenstein lived in a time and place in which one was forced, on variously articulated and often quite sinister grounds, to answer with a Yes or a No to the question, “Are you Jewish?” And this fact he experienced, especially at certain times in his life, as something fearful and painful and threatening to his sense of self. He had no way of answering Yes or No cleanly, and this bothered him and fascinated him.

Stern is right to criticize McGuinness for arguing that we “need not” think of Wittgenstein as Jewish on grounds that the whole topic is too confused or mystical to bear clear thinking. This reinforces a tendency Stern identifies and rejects among scholars to ignore the topic altogether, or to just mention it briefly, quickly moving on, as if embarrassed by it. Stern also rejects the idea (forwarded by both Monk and McGuinness) that we may hope to dilute the poison in Wittgenstein’s writing about Jews (including his acceptance of negative cultural stereotypes and his admiration of Weininger) by interpreting them as primarily or ultimately a matter of Wittgenstein’s self-reflective efforts at self-definition and self-criticism. Though they are certainly this, our shock at them is inevitably a function of what we know of the time and place in which they were written. McGuinness takes pains to assert that Wittgenstein was right to minimize his Jewishness, because his family had converted to Catholicism, and because life in Ludwig’s childhood household did not seem culturally Jewish at all, and Wittgenstein’s family never felt any special attachment to Jews as Jews. But this assertion, true though it is according to the letter of Christian doctrine, and true also according to certain sorts of perceptions of Jewishness—Wittgenstein’s family did not celebrate Passover, or light Sabbath candles Friday night, or wear yarmulkes—credits too little the psychological, philosophical, and emotional impact on Wittgenstein of the dislocated culture in which he lived and breathed. This was one in which, as boys, he and his brother Paul were barred from joining a gymnastics club because of their Jewish origins, and Ludwig (unlike Paul) wanted to lie about it; in which his near-fiancée Marguerite expressed her dislike of his close friend Engelmann by calling him “the sort of Jew one didn’t like”, and in which Ludwig’s sisters handed over a great deal of money to the Nazis to buy Aryan papers, dispatching (the apparently willing) Ludwig to Berlin and New York in 1939 to make the arrangements and to persuade brother Paul, against his wishes, to go along with it. Perhaps Ludwig’s hand in this last action was, as McGuinness says, in keeping with the family tradition of professed Catholicism, but it seems clear that the whole affair caused Wittgenstein duress. The Wittgenstein family was assimilated, but could not fully assimilate, despite their wealth and beneficence. Their Jewishness consisted in their being treated and perceived as Jewish, not in their consumption of matzoh-ball soup or their dress, and this perception was all the more painful as the family’s conversion, life-style, wealth, prominence and loyalty to Austro-Hungary was about as complete an effort at successful assimilation as there could possibly have been. McGuinness rightly criticizes the vague idea of a Jewish science or Jewish philosophy, but when he calls for an “objective basis” for assessing Wittgenstein’s and his Vienna’s Jewishness, he does not seem to me to sufficiently emphasize the most important objective facts. Wittgenstein’s Jewishness was defined for him, against the letter of what he had been taught. It could neither be accepted nor denied by him fully. It was much more than “a detail of descent that objectively meant nothing”.

Stern’s essay lucidly surveys and analyzes both Wittgenstein’s remarks about Jewishness and what readers have made of them in secondary literature to date. He is right to steer a middle course between those who would condemn Wittgenstein as having expressed full-throated assertions of prejudice, and those who would excuse him by claiming that the notion of “Jewishness” plays no serious role in his reflections at all, because they are merely self-examinations, or that Wittgenstein takes up negative stereotypes about rabble and tumors on the nation in order to exorcise them with philosophical therapy (on himself). No, Wittgenstein took up and took upon himself the nasty terms in which Christian Europe had for ages understood the Jews—as an unnatural foreign cultural element, dangerously desirous of power and riches because of their lack of landedness, but, above all, a theologically backward, spiritless group who had never been willing to accept the doctrines of the Gospel as the new, true, interpretation of the law. Here was a tangle, as Stern says, that Wittgenstein did not untie by or in his philosophy; though he might have unmasked anti-semitic prejudices, he accepted, at least in certain diary entries, the anti-semitic ways of thinking of his time. In the end, how Jewish it was of him to understand his denial of his Jewishness, his cutting himself off from that community, as a wrong; and how Catholic to have undertaken a confession to try to cleanse himself of this sin!

If it is to be inheritable, a philosophy must be able to stand quite apart from the life of the philosopher who conceived it. And to be properly understood and evaluated, it ought not to be reduced to its social or historical or political or psychological context. Philosophy is what it is, and not another thing. Yet the feeling remains that one cannot ultimately separate the philosophy from the person, for philosophy concerns itself not merely with the facts, but with the intertwining of fact and value, with the ways in which thinking and living are colored by (and color) what we say and think about them. Insofar as these essays manage collectively to confront the idea of a Wittgensteinian ethic or way or life, one would hope that they will serve to make Wittgenstein’s philosophy better understood, both by professional scholars of Wittgenstein and by those who know of him primarily through a reading of the history of his life.