Wittgenstein: Comparisons and Context

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P. M. S. Hacker, Wittgenstein: Comparisons and Context, Oxford University Press, 2013, 250pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199674824.

Reviewed by Diego Marconi, University of Turin


P. M. S. Hacker is an eminent Wittgenstein scholar, the author of Insight and Illusion (1st ed. 1972, 2nd ed. 1986), which some regard as the best book ever written on Wittgenstein; of a monumental commentary to the Philosophical Investigations (four volumes (1980-1996), the first two in cooperation with the late G. P. Baker); and of many articles, some of them collected in Wittgenstein: Connections and Controversies (2001). He also edited (with J. Schulte) the 4th edition of the Investigations (2009). His knowledge of Wittgenstein's writings, published and unpublished, is probably unsurpassed.

As the title indicates, all essays in this collection are concerned with Wittgenstein, with the partial exception of the last two: the first, "Passing by the Naturalistic Turn: on Quine's cul-de-sac", is an unsparing critique of Quine's philosophy; the second, "Analytic Philosophy: What, Whence, and Whither?", recounts the vicissitudes of analytic philosophy, from Moore and Russell to the present "decline" due to misguided naturalism. As one would expect, many reconstructions of Wittgenstein's philosophical itinerary are illuminating. For example, the first part of Chapter 7, "Wittgenstein on Grammar, Theses, and Dogmatism", criticizes the suggestion that Wittgenstein's notion of grammar as introduced in the Big Typescript and other writings of the same period differs in a philosophically important way from the Investigations' notion of grammar. Hacker convincingly argues that the two accounts of grammar perfectly cohere

Chapter 4, "The Development of Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Psychology", reconstructs in considerable detail the evolution of Wittgenstein's attitude towards psychology and of his analysis of psychological vocabulary. The main turning point occurs in the early and mid-1930s, when Wittgenstein dismantled his earlier views on the connection between language and reality, replacing the Tractatus account of intentionality in terms of "projection" with an entirely "intra-grammatical resolution of the problems of the intentionality of the proposition" (p. 88). He then proceeded to develop the conceptions that are familiar from the Investigations, such as the "expressive", non-eliminativist conception of the relation of behavior to the mental, the related idea that behavior is not inductive but logical evidence of the inner, and the contention that the notion of privacy as applied to experience is hopelessly confused. After 1946, Wittgenstein devoted an even larger amount of work to our ordinary psychological vocabulary, for which he intended to provide an overview or "chart", or for which he aimed to find "a new filing system". Hacker follows this attempt (actually, several distinct attempts, as he shows) with painstaking care; the impression one receives is that they were somewhat inconclusive.

In 1930, Wittgenstein was still convinced that linguistic expressions acquire their semantic properties by way of "projection", i.e., by intending by a proposition a certain state of affairs. "One could say," he writes,

that the intention is the method of projection. The picture . . . does not suffice because how it is to be compared with reality is not given with it. Together with it must be the method of projection; but then the picture indeed reaches right into the place where the object of the picture is. (quoted on p. 84)

It is intention that "gives life" to the sign. Not much later, use of signs replaced intention in this life-giving function. At that point, according to Hacker, Wittgenstein gave up the whole picture of a language-to-world connection in favor of the idea that "It is in language that is all done" (Philosophical Grammar, p. 143; quoted on p. 88). Wittgenstein doesn't say much about how it is done; for example, could we adequately describe our use of language without ever mentioning perception? Or should perceptual input be regarded as part of language, like objects that are used as "samples" to explain the use of the word 'red'? One feels that Hacker might have pointed out such lack of explicitness (and, ultimately, of clarity).

This indicates a general problem with Hacker's work on the later Wittgenstein. Hacker's relation to Wittgenstein's thought is not just that of the exegete or the historian of philosophy: he is a committed Wittgensteinian, i.e., he fully endorses what he takes to be the later Wittgenstein's conception of philosophy and most of the analytic results he achieved. Sometimes, this leads him to ignore or downplay what others would regard as difficulties in Wittgenstein's thought or obvious objections that could be raised against individual points he makes. For example, take the already mentioned "thesis" that behavior is not inductive but criterial (logical) evidence for the mental. This seems to entail that we do not conjecture the mental from behavior, which, in turn, could be taken to entail that we cannot go wrong. But we do, or say we do: Hacker's Wittgenstein concedes that criteria are defeasible. Surely a difference can be drawn between putting forth a conjecture and applying a defeasible criterion: but is it a logical or a merely psychological difference?

Or again, take the conclusion that "understanding a word, sentence or utterance" is not a mental state or process but "akin to an ability" (p. 148). This is borne out by some uses of 'understand', as in "Though she understands written English quite well, she has trouble with spoken English", but not by others ("She knows how to understand this sentence" -- ?). Moreover, an ability to do what? Abilities are individuated by their complements; e.g., sight is an ability, it is the ability to see. Once we have established so much concerning our use of the word 'sight' -- no big achievement in itself -- what we are really interested is in what seeing is -- what the exercise of the ability consists in. In the case of understanding, we seem to use the same word for both the ability ("She understands English") and its exercise: when we say "Did you understand what I said?" we are not asking whether our interlocutor possessed a certain ability but whether he exercised it. Maybe he did not exercise it because he did not possess it, but that is a separate issue. When we ask, "Did you see that house on top of that hill?" we are not asking our interlocutor whether he happens to be blind. Wouldn't this point deserve some discussion?

This criticism particularly applies to the later Wittgenstein's overall conception of philosophy as presented by Hacker. Here, Hacker's endorsement of Wittgenstein's views is explicit: the book's introductory chapter, "Philosophy: a Contribution not to Human Knowledge but to Human Understanding", outlines a conception of philosophy that is both his own and explicitly derived from his reading of Wittgenstein. In this view, "philosophy strives for an overview of the structure of (parts of) our conceptual scheme and of logico-grammatical relations between its elements" (p. 12). Such an overview requires characterizations of concepts, and this is done by "describing the relevant features of the uses of expressions that express [a] concept" (p. 13); these concepts are constituted by "the sense-determining rules for the use of the words that express them" (p. 17). With such rules "we are perfectly familiar" (p. 18); they cannot be unknown to speakers, for "one cannot guide oneself by reference to unknown rules, and one cannot use unknown rules as standards of correctness" (p. 19). This is why "in philosophy we already have all the information we need to solve our problems" (p. 21): philosophy is, in this sense, entirely a priori (p. 15).

All this is rather apodictically stated: many obvious (and well known) objections are not addressed. For example, if "our conceptual scheme" is to be investigated by surveying our ordinary use of words, can such use really be conceived as completely segregated from scientific uses? E.g., is our ordinary use of 'mind' and related words entirely isolated from scientific theories of the mind and the brain? If such admixtures are just confusions (the source of philosophical troubles to be dissolved), does that mean that philosophy requires some preliminary selection of the uses of words that count as really ordinary? (By the way, as a native speaker of Italian, I was struck by the fact that in the natural Italian translations of some uses of the word 'mind' that Hacker regards as paradigmatic (p. 20), the Italian equivalent of 'mind' is not used at all. Do Italians have a different concept of mind? A very old issue.)

In fact, some such selection cannot be avoided. Wittgenstein himself felt free to choose to consider the uses of language that struck him as particularly telling. Hacker rightly complains that traditional truth-theoretic semantics disregards "what we call 'an explanation of meaning'" (p. 140), but when he objects to Frege that "Concepts, as we use the term, are not functions but ways of using a certain range of words" (p. 141), he is forgetting that ordinary speakers would be surprised to learn that concepts -- as they use the term -- are neither abstract entities nor mental entities but ways of using words. This, in itself, does not disqualify attention to ordinary linguistic usage as a gateway to philosophical analysis, but it does suggest a less objectivist attitude. Even if "nothing is hidden", a lot depends on what we choose to look at.

But is it true that nothing is hidden? Wittgenstein famously held that "If one tried to advance theses in philosophy, it would never be possible to debate them, because everyone would agree to them" (PI §128); also, that "We may not advance any kind of theory" (§ 109). Yet sometimes his research issued in conclusions that look very much like philosophical theses: e.g., "Grammar is arbitrary", "Arithmetical propositions are norms of representation", or "There is no such thing as a private ostensive definition"; contentions that look obviously controversial. Hacker explicitly addresses this issue in Ch. 7. He concedes that "not all grammatical propositions are immediately obvious" (p. 165). But why should we regard Wittgenstein's apparently controversial tenets as grammatical propositions in the first place? Hacker's answer is that they are formulations of rules, more precisely, of exclusionary rules: e.g., the (seeming) assertion about private ostensive definitions is meant to exclude the expression "private ostensive definition" as meaningless (what about the assertion about arithmetic? Is it clear what expressions it is meant to exclude?).

Of course, that expressions such as "private ostensive definition" are meaningless is not immediately obvious but "has to be shown, step by step". However, the way this is done in the Investigations looks very much like a philosophical argument, though not a particularly well organized one (even Hacker refers to the discussion of private language as "the most important battery of philosophical arguments in the twentieth century" (p.xiii, emphasis mine)). Prima facie, it doesn't seem that it is done by "assembling and marshalling a select array of familiar rules for the use of words" (p. 166), as Hacker claims. But even if Wittgenstein's analyses could somehow be presented in that format (and it is far from clear that they could), a conspicuous difference would remain between "Red things are colored" and "Bachelors are unmarried" (Hacker's examples), whose obviousness derives from their being part of common semantic competence, and "There is no private language" or "Arithmetical propositions are norms of representation", whose connection with "familiar rules for the use of words" is (in the best of cases) remote from the semantic awareness of even the most competent of speakers. What is, then, the point of insisting that "nothing is hidden" if the real nature of such seemingly problematic assertions can only be revealed by long and painstaking analysis (and, one must add, definitely not to everyone's immediate satisfaction)?

As both Wittgenstein's conception of philosophy and many of his results are at odds with much analytic philosophy of the last fifty years, Hacker has been consistently denouncing the regressive turn that analytic philosophy took after the 1970's, particularly under the influence of Quine's philosophical work. Indeed, he thinks that analytic philosophy has all but ended: the abandonment of the three distinctions, analytic/synthetic, a priori/a posteriori, and contingent/necessary, and of any "related" distinction has brought about the "collapse" of the conception of philosophy that had characterized the analytic tradition. Without some distinction between questions of meaning and questions of fact "the status of philosophy as an independent discipline is undermined", which "spells the end of analytic philosophy" and "opens the gate to speculative science in the guise of philosophy" (pp .236-237) (Hacker fails to mention that Saul Kripke, a towering figure in analytic philosophy of the last decades, preserved all three distinctions that Quine had supposedly undermined).

Hacker devoted a lengthy book (Wittgenstein's Place in Twentieth-Century Analytic Philosophy, 1996) to the rise and fall of analytic philosophy, where the crucial role in accelerating the fall is played by "Quine's apostasy". In the present collection the theme is resumed in the longest chapter, "Analytic Philosophy: What, Whence, and Whither?" (first published in 1998). Concerning the "What?", Hacker convincingly argues that analytic philosophy cannot be characterized by any single feature: even analysis was understood in different ways by Moore, Russell, the positivists, and the ordinary language philosophers; on the other hand, a watered-down notion of analysis would include Descartes and the British empiricists among analytic philosophers (would that be wrong? The assumption that it would seems to presuppose Hacker's thesis that analytic philosophy must have an historical identity). Widely discussed definitions such as Michael Dummett's ("A philosophical account of thought by means of a philosophical account of language"), Anthony Kenny's (the linguistic turn), and Hans Sluga's (philosophy of language as the foundation of philosophy) are also rejected. Hacker's conclusion is that the concept of analytic philosophy is both a family resemblance concept and an historical concept: analytic philosophy is a tradition, in which "some threads [are] abandoned . . . others become more prominent in the weave" (p. 224). This is very close to H. J. Glock's view in What Is Analytic Philosophy? (2008): it seems that Hacker was there before his former student.

In his brief reconstruction of the tradition, Hacker gives pride of place to Wittgenstein's Tractatus and presents the Vienna Circle's ideas as stemming from it, "sometimes as a result of misinterpretation" (p. 231). The last episode he regards as part of the tradition is P. F. Strawson's descriptive metaphysics of Individuals (1959), another attempt at "the description of the most general features of our conceptual scheme" (p. 233), very much in line with late Wittgensteinian philosophy. Thereafter came Quine's Word and Object (1960), "a decisive break" with the analytic tradition as we already saw. Most of what followed was scientism, conceptual confusion enhanced by the emergence of cognitive science, and "putative ontological enquiries" as to whether certain entities exist (misguidedly replacing analysis of what our attributions of existence mean) (p. 237). Finally, in characterizing the heritage of the analytic tradition Hacker identifies it with two late Wittgensteinian themes: resolving conceptual puzzlement and dissolving conceptual confusion, and the perspicuous presentation of our use of words. However, one feels that the tradition contains much more than that. Even Hacker, while excoriating Quine, grudgingly admits that he "harks back to Russell in certain respects" (p. 237). It seems that though Hacker admits -- indeed, emphasizes -- that analytic philosophy is not, and never was a theoretically consistent enterprise, he has some difficulty in drawing the consequences.