Wittgenstein: Connections and Controversies

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Hacker, P.M.S, Wittgenstein: Connections and Controversies, Oxford University Press, 2001, 375pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 019924569.

Reviewed by Meredith Williams, Johns Hopkins University


Over the last twenty years there have been major reassessments of Wittgenstein’s philosophy, in terms of both which arguments or texts are the most significant and how these texts are to be interpreted. These reassessments can be seen as challenging much of what has become the standard interpretation of Wittgenstein. This standard interpretation can be attributed to a large extent to the interpretive work of P.M.S. Hacker, though of course many others contributed to it, including the late G.P. Baker, Hacker’s co-author of many books and articles. The general shape of the standard interpretation is now quite familiar. Wittgenstein ushered in two great movements in 20th-century Anglo-American philosophy, each centered on a distinctive philosophy of language. The Tractatus articulated and defended a fully general theory of representation, according to which the underlying logical syntax of any system of representation must be isomorphic to the logical space of combination of ontologically simple objects. The later philosophy of the Philosophical Investigations rejects this picture of language and reality. The Investigations subjects the central theses of the Tractatus to powerful criticism, and in doing so radically reorients us in our understanding of language. Language must be understood, first and foremost, as a practical ability to use words in the context of on-going activities within particular circumstances. These abilities and activities are rule-governed through and through, and as such are irreducibly normative. The norms that constitute these language-games are expressed in grammatical propositions that are autonomous in that they cannot be explained or justified in terms of anything else.

Wittgenstein: Connections and Controversies is a collection of 13 of Hacker’s previously published papers, nine since 1999. In these papers, Hacker defends the standard interpretation from some of its most serious challenges. Four great controversies in Wittgenstein interpretation are addressed. Three of these are driven, in part, by an emerging new interpretation of the Tractatus, one propounded and defended by Cora Diamond and James Conant. This new “austere reading,” as I shall call it, of the Tractatus is taken to have profound implications for the later work as well. These four controversies are the following: (1) The austere reading vs. the standard interpretation of the Tractatus (chs. 4-6); (2) Wittgenstein’s relation to Frege, Russell, and logical positivism, particularly concerning what he accepts and what he rejects in Frege’s writings (chs. 7-9 and 12); (3) the degree of continuity or discontinuity between the early and late philosophy (chs. 1-2 and 9); and (4) the community view of rule-following vs. the individual-regularity view (chs. 10-11). The austere reading of the Tractatus finds a great indebtedness to Frege’s semantic theory and a strong continuity between the Tractatus and the Investigations with respect to Wittgenstein’s philosophical goal and method. The community view challenges the autonomy of grammar. Hacker takes issue with all these claims. A common thread running through these debates is Wittgenstein’s treatment of logic and grammar, and so necessity.

The controversies raise questions concerning connections: the philosophical connections Wittgenstein’s thought has to other philosophers, especially Frege, and the connections between the early and late philosophy. But the idea of connection that is most crucial is that of necessary connection. Wittgenstein’s treatment of necessity both early and late is tied to his methodology and metaphilosophy. Diamond takes the leading idea of the Tractatus to be that “logic takes care of itself.” Hacker takes “the autonomy of grammar” to be the leading idea of the Philosophical Investigations. Both take these slogans to prohibit the possibility of philosophical explanation of necessity and meaning. Where Diamond sees this as the great continuity between the Tractatus and the Investigations, both as its goal and method, Hacker argues that it marks the great discontinuity between the two periods since the Tractatus develops theories of necessity and meaning while the Investigations resists these temptations to theory. My own view is that much in Hacker’s criticisms of the austere reading is correct, while his own account of grammar is inadequate. Let’s begin with the challenge raised by the austere reading of the Tractatus.

This reading privileges Wittgenstein’s metaphilosophical remarks, especially the penultimate passage of the Tractatus, in which Wittgenstein states that “anyone who understands me eventually recognizes [the propositions of the Tractatus] as nonsensical, when he has used them—as steps—to climb up beyond them” (T 6.54). Except for the Preface and the final passages, the propositions of the Tractatus are strict nonsense – gibberish – without meaning and without syntactic or logical form. Wittgenstein’s method, it is held, is to bring the reader to recognize that these apparently well-formed meaningful sentences are gibberish. Consequently, there is no endorsement of an ontology of simple objects, a picture theory of meaning, a theory of logic or anything else from within the Tractatus. There is only the illusion of meaningful sentences. Philosophical sentences are shown to be nonsense not on the basis of a theory of representation, but by means of a method that brings the reader to recognize that they are saying nothing at all. According to the austere reader, this method and its complementary goal remain the same throughout Wittgenstein’s philosophical work. The differences then are differences of tactics rather than differences of goal, method or conception of traditional philosophy. Thus, the debate over the proper way to read the Tractatus is profoundly important.

Hacker’s criticisms of the austere reading are pointed and to the mark. I am going to discuss just two of the several arguments that Hacker mounts, one internal and one external. First, a gloss on the austere reader’s account of the crucial idea that “logic must look after itself….In a certain sense, we cannot make mistakes in logic” (T 5.473). The idea of a logical syntax setting the limits of meaningfulness invites the thought that the rules of logic could themselves be violated in some way. This opens the possibility of an illogical thought, that is, an attempt to place constituent elements that are semantically respectable into a combination that appears to meet the requirements of ordinary syntax but fail in some deeper way to meet the requirements of logical syntax. Wittgenstein’s point, on Diamond’s view, is that there is no such thing as violating the rules of logical syntax. Indeed on her view a theory that suggests this possibility is plain nonsense. Nor is this error ameliorated by an appeal to the doctrine of showing, that is, to the idea that meaningful sentences show the contours of logical syntax, and so the limits of meaningfulness. At the end of the Tractatus, nothing has been said and nothing has been shown. Rather we stop doing philosophy of this explanatory sort.

What is Hacker’s objection to this construal of the “autonomy of logic”, as we might call it? He agrees with the following claims. We cannot have an illogical thought. Any attempt to express an illogical thought is nonsense. It most emphatically does not express a possibility that is logically impossible. So, how does his view of these claims differ from that propounded by Diamond? The crux of the difference turns on whether there is such a thing as violating the rules of syntax. Hacker holds that illogical thought is a violation of the rules of logical syntax, rules that are constitutive of thought and language. The explanation of nonsense is given by a failure to comply with the rules of logical syntax (cf. pp. 118-122). It is this explanatory role assigned logical syntax that Diamond rejects. For her, nonsensical sentences are not something that occur and require explanation for why these sentences are nonsensical. Rather nonsensical sentences cannot be produced. What we produce simply aren’t sentences at all. So, we do not need an explanation for what makes this class of “sentences” nonsensical. This is the way in which logic takes care of itself. What does require an explanation on Diamond’s view is a psychological matter, namely, why philosophers are prone to treat certain acoustic or visible strings that are not sentences as sentences. This calls for a psychological explanation for why certain individuals are tempted into this kind of enterprise we call philosophy. This is a significant difference. For Hacker, there is a philosophical explanation of nonsense. For Diamond, there is only a psychological explanation of those who utter nonsense. This is the divide between thinking that the Tractatus offers explanatory philosophical theories of some sort and thinking that no explanation of a philosophical sort is to be found anywhere in the Tractatus.

The internal problem with the austere reading, in general terms, lies with its fractured strategy. Strictly, the lines are gibberish and yet they must be treated as meaningful, contributing to arguments and theories in order to explain how one comes to recognize that they are gibberish. Hacker points out that Diamond cannot avoid drawing on some of the very elements and claims in her arguments that she identified as nonsense in her conclusions. The Tractatus becomes a gnostic text. This apparent incoherence makes the debate concerning the early Wittgenstein’s relation to Frege critical, for Diamond holds that the argumentative work is done by way of Frege’s context principle and not by way of any thesis within the Tractatus. This too Hacker disputes.

Hacker’s external objections are presented in a thorough and convincing manner. Wittgenstein’s notebooks, correspondence and lectures both before and after the completion of the Tractatus press strongly against the austere reading. To make these many sources consistent with the austere reading requires a massive hermeneutic reinterpretation. This cannot but involve attributing something very close to dissembling to Wittgenstein in his manuscripts and correspondence. It is difficult to see how, for example, the austere reader can accommodate the argument of Wittgenstein’s 1929 paper “Some Remarks on Logical Form”. since that paper addresses the color-exclusion problem, using it to challenge the Tractatus thesis that elementary propositions are semantically and logically independent of each other. If Wittgenstein did not endorse the theories that make the independence thesis necessary, just what is he doing in this paper and in other of his philosophical writings that purport to criticize or otherwise repudiate the claims of the Tractatus?

Now to the defining controversy concerning the Philosophical Investigations. Just as the interpretation of the Tractatus’s conception of nonsense does much to fix whether one finds positive theory in the text or complete quietism, so one’s interpretation of rule-following does much to fix whether one finds philosophical explanation or quietism in the Investigations. It is now generally agreed, pace Kripke’s interpretation, that Wittgenstein did not introduce a new skeptical problem to which he offered a Humean skeptical solution. Hacker and G.P. Baker were early critics of Kripke’s take on Wittgenstein, and it is correct to say that they won the day on this matter. Their 1984 critique of Kripke is reprinted in this collection along with a later article by Hacker alone criticizing Norman Malcolm’s defense of a social conception of rule-following.

Hacker’s criticism of the social view is closely tied to his conception of Wittgenstein’s later method, one that he calls “connective analysis.” The phrase comes from P.F. Strawson’s Individuals, and is linked to Strawson’s distinction between descriptive metaphysics and revisionary metaphysics, the topic of the final essays in this book. Connective analysis is a descriptive method that makes perspicuous the inferential and logical connections that obtain within regions of our ordinary language. It is a form of conceptual analysis, the adequacy of which is a function of the autonomy of grammar. On Hacker’s construal, the autonomy of grammar requires a strong and principled distinction between the necessary (or conceptual) and the contingent (or empirical). This perspicuous display, it is held, makes clear the confusions and mistakes made by philosophers in their construction of theories of language, mind and reality. The social view is another instance of conceptual confusion.

Conceptual confusion occurs most typically, according to Hacker, when philosophers attempt to externalize internal relations. This is a conceptual confusion because it takes what is set down by rules to be merely contingently obtaining conjunctions or associations or causal relations. Philosophers seeking to understand or explain how rules determine their applications or how a word can refer to an object or why a subject cannot be mistaken about his sensations all make the same mistake. They all treat the necessities created by rules as contingently obtaining relations. It is enough to point out, on Hacker’s view, that internal relations obtain among the apparently discrete relata. Thus, “the concept of a rule is internally related to the concept of rule-following” (p. 262); “my use of an expression must agree, accord, with my correct explanation of what it means” (p. 300); “…patterns of internal relations…are constitutive of the meanings of words and sentences” (p. 60). These appeals to internal relations are used to reveal the confusions in looking for an explanation for how a rule guides action, how an explanation of meaning is sufficient to ensure correct use, and other mistaken attempts at philosophical explanation.

The problem with Hacker’s method of argument is its over-reliance on the appeal to internal relations. We want to know, after all, what internal relations are and how they are correctly identified if merely appealing to them is sufficient to relieve philosophers from the “muddles,” to use a favorite phrase of Hacker’s, in which they find themselves. Hacker tells his reader “internal relations are specified by grammatical statements—which are no more than statements of grammatical rules. And grammar, far from ineffably reflecting he logical structure of the world, is ‘arbitrary’” (p. 152). Once a rule of grammar has been cited in a debate, there is no further philosophical work to be done. Grammar just is a pattern of necessary internal relations. Now one comes to feel that perhaps Hacker has been “seduced into using a super-expression. (It might be called a philosophical superlative.)” (PI 192). That super-expression is “internal relation”.

In the later essays of this collection, Hacker is sensitive to the need to elaborate further on how “grammar” is to be understood: “…we crave some explanation of the nature of such non-logical, yet non-empirical necessity that is not evidently analytic” (p. 360). At the very heart of Hacker’s method is the traditional distinction between the conceptual and the empirical combined with a rejection of the traditional ways to understand this distinction. They are not true in virtue of the meanings of the constituent terms, and they do not specify the conditions that are necessary for the possibility of language-use or experience (cf. pp. 162, 341-2). He draws on Strawson’s idea of descriptive metaphysics to illuminate the idea of a grammatical investigation, but Strawson’s strategy is neo-Kantian. Since the viability of his arguments turns on this distinction between the conceptual and the empirical, Hacker owes his reader further elaboration of what the distinction consists in and how it is to be defended. It is simply not enough to say that those who question the distinction are “in a muddle” since the debate is precisely over whether such a principled contrast can be sustained.