Wittgenstein in Exile

Placeholder book cover

James C. Klagge, Wittgenstein in Exile, MIT Press, 2011, 249pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015349.

Reviewed by Lars Hertzberg, Åbo Akademi University


In Wittgenstein in Exile, James Klagge discusses the tendency of philosophers from the time of Wittgenstein down to this day to find his thought either difficult to understand, hard to accept, or both. He argues that the difficulty is not so much one of style or method, but rather of the spirit in which Wittgenstein worked, and he suggests that the problem should be seen in the light of the intellectual distance between Wittgenstein and his cultural surroundings, a distance that he himself was painfully aware of and that can be characterized by means of the metaphor of exile. Wittgenstein, Klagge claims, was an exile in space but also in time: in Spenglerian terms, Wittgenstein saw himself as the representative of a culture that was already a matter of the past, while his audience belonged to its present state of decline. (At this point, it might be objected that Wittgenstein saw himself as torn between the old and the new; thus, he worried about the fact that he was not carrying out the kind of work the great classical philosophers had done.) While on this theme, one might ask whether Wittgenstein's sexual orientation may not have contributed to his sense of exile.

Klagge's book is rich and varied in content, to the point of being scattered, combining biography and cultural history with philosophy (including 62 pages of endnotes). To make his case, Klagge, on the one hand, invokes facts about Wittgenstein's life, the way he thought about himself and his work, while on the other hand he discusses features of Wittgenstein's thought that may strike us as particularly difficult to embrace.

One might ask: does not the idea that we need to invoke something external in order to understand a philosopher presuppose that there is something askew with his work? Wittgenstein put this issue in a nutshell in his letter to C. K. Ogden, the editor of the Tractatus: "Why should the general reviewer know my age? Is it as much as to say: You can't expect more of a young chap especially when he writes a book in such noise as must have been on the Austrian front?" (Quoted on p. 12).

Be that as it may, this is not the type of explaining Klagge is engaged in. He is not so much trying to account for Wittgenstein's ideas from his life, but rather to explain our difficulty understanding him from the relation between his life and ours, i.e., as one might put it, the life of the average Western intellectual of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century. If there is a shortcoming here, it is to be laid at least as much at our door as at Wittgenstein's. This seems to me to be a central strand of Klagge's argument.

Klagge might have said more about the different senses in which a philosopher's work might be called difficult. It does not go without saying that what Wittgenstein meant when he worried that he would not be understood coincided with what his readers have in mind when they feel they are not getting it. In fact, the main part of Wittgenstein's worry was probably that people would think they understood him when they did not. Anyway, Klagge argues that the difficulty of the early work is different in kind from that of the Philosophical Investigations. Perhaps surprisingly, he suggests that what has made the Tractatus particularly hard to understand is the way Wittgenstein combines issues of logic with the concluding discussion of existential matters. Wittgenstein's existential concerns, he claims, are to be understood against the background of his experience of the First World War. This may be so, but of course what a great many readers have found at least as daunting as the combination of themes are the logical parts in themselves. Klagge touches on these only briefly, simply claiming that Wittgenstein in the Tractatus had presented a picture theory of meaning, thus passing by the recent debate between the advocates of the standard reading (see, e.g., Hacker 2003) and the resolute reading (see, e.g., Crary & Read 2000) of the work. Whether these difficulties can be accounted for in terms of Wittgenstein's life or his cultural background is, to put it mildly, a hard question.

As for the Philosophical Investigations, Klagge argues that some of the difficulties are due to Wittgenstein himself, some to the subject matter and some to his audience. He makes an important distinction between cases in which Wittgenstein has succeeded to some extent in getting through to his audience, as in questioning the idea (common both to Socrates and to contemporary scientific culture) that concepts, to be useful, must admit of precise and unified definitions, and cases in which his thinking has been met with incredulity and resistance, as in questioning the intelligibility of the notion of the inverted colour spectrum (the idea that, for all we know, red, say, may not look to me the way it does to you). Klagge does a good job of expounding Wittgenstein's criticism of the latter idea, which is, of course, an aspect of his questioning of the idea of a private language. He does not make clear, however, why the difficulty of grasping what is wrong with the idea of the inverted spectrum should be bound up with the cultural distance between Wittgenstein and his readers. Wittgenstein himself (as Klagge notes in a different place) thought that the most intractable problems of philosophy were rooted in features of language that have remained the same (in European languages) at least since the time of Plato.

Klagge makes a stronger case for the culture-bound character of philosophical difficulties when discussing Wittgenstein's resistance to the contemporary tendency to regard science as a predominant mode of understanding. This discussion constitutes the central part of the book. Klagge discusses what he calls Wittgenstein's insulation thesis: the claim that scientific findings are not relevant to philosophical problems; thus the discoveries of neurology will not have any direct bearing on our understanding of psychological concepts. In Klagge's reading, the insulation thesis is grounded in the fact that philosophy studies meanings; meanings are given with the criteria, and these are within the grasp of ordinary speakers.

There may be an empirical inquiry, say, into the neurological basis of pain, but this will not tell us anything new about the way the word "pain" is to be used. Klagge spins out an interchange around this issue: the advocate of the relevance of science may point out that the criteria of our words may be, and often have been, shifted in consequence of scientific discoveries; to this the insulationist may retort that if the criteria are changed we are no longer dealing with the same concepts; here Klagge steps in and reminds us that Wittgenstein himself conceded that concepts are not bound up with fixed criteria. In fact, on one occasion Wittgenstein invoked Hertz's proposal that physicists should abandon the concept of force as showing how one may get rid of a perplexity by abandoning a concept; this appears to be in tension with the predominant perception that according to Wittgenstein philosophy leaves everything as it is. Klagge, it is true, here makes a distinction between the philosophical resolution of a philosophical problem, which is achieved through getting an overview of the use of a concept, and the conceptual resolution of it, which may be brought about by getting rid of the concept (as in the physics case). Nevertheless, he ends up conceding that, according to Wittgenstein, the concepts that give rise to philosophical puzzles are not amenable to conceptual reform.

This discussion is interesting as such; yet I have a sense that the idea that scientific progress might lead to a change in how we use psychological concepts should be countered earlier on and more forcefully. If we compare the case of a word like "pain" with that of "flu", which Klagge discusses, it should be clear that the role of criteria is different. (Indeed, one might question whether the same word "criterion" should even be used in both cases.) In the case of physical illness, one central concern is with identifying the condition. It is natural that as we learn more, we may find it convenient to replace one set of criteria with another, more precise one. This would not change the place of "flu talk" in our lives. However, to imagine "replacing" our present way of talking about pain with one grounded in neural findings is to imagine a radical change in the place occupied by "pain talk". Just ask yourself what this would mean in terms of complaining about one's pain, expressing compassion, etc.? What this comes down to is that one could hardly think about this as a form of replacement. (This also shows that what is meant by speaking about concepts being the same or not the same is different in these cases.) Klagge does concede that psychological concepts have what he calls a deliberative use which could not be accounted for in neurological terms, but in my view this rather understates the issue.

In a somewhat parallel discussion, Klagge addresses the idea that "folk psychology", including our conception of ourselves as rational agents, might be undermined by the findings of neurology, since this branch of inquiry has no place for the notion of an I. He thinks it possible that the notion of human agency might be choked by scientism, and he considers what the cost of this might be. Again, Klagge seems to concede too much to the reductionists: abandoning the notions of reasoning and agency, it seems, would not simply bring about a cultural shift as he imagines; after all, how could scientific inquiry proceed without them? (An alternative that Klagge might have considered is that presented in Cockburn 1995.)

(While on this theme, one might have wished that Klagge had given a more direct treatment of Wittgenstein's rejection of representational accounts of the mind, bringing him into confrontation with contemporary philosophy of mind and cognitive science.)

Klagge notes that for Wittgenstein the question of the correspondence between mind and brain is bound up with another theme, that of "seed/plant correspondence". The analogy is broached in Wittgenstein 1980, §903:

No supposition seems to me more natural than that there is no process in the brain correlated with associating or with thinking; so that it would be impossible to read off thought-processes from brain-processes … The case would be like the following -- certain kinds of plants multiply by seed, so that a seed always produces a plant of the same kind as that from which it was produced -- but nothing in the seed corresponds to the plant which comes from it (Quoted on p. 98).

Let us note in passing that the way Wittgenstein chose to formulate this point is quite arresting. It would have been more in keeping with our expectations if he had written: "It seems natural to assume that there is a process in the brain associated with thinking, and that there is something in the seed that corresponds to the plant, but actually this need not be so." This fact may simply testify to a stylistic predilection on Wittgenstein's part, a weakness for a certain kind of overstatement.

This point aside, it would seem that the two sides of the analogy are not really comparable. Let us here concentrate on the seed/plant issue. Klagge distinguishes between a weak and a strong reading of Wittgenstein's denial. On the weak reading, Wittgenstein is denying the necessity of an isomorphism between seed and plant, on the strong reading he is denying that there is anything about the seed that accounts for the fact that it will produce a plant of the same kind as that from which it came: two seeds might be identical and yet bring forth different plants. Both readings have some grounding in Wittgenstein's texts. He returned to the seed/plant issue on several occasions between 1937 and 1947, and Klagge claims that whereas Wittgenstein's formulation of this thought was fairly cautious in the 1930's while he was teaching, he became more categorical in the 1940's when he was writing for a future audience, in the isolation of his study. The weak reading is not very controversial; in fact, it is in line with Wittgenstein's general rejection of apriorism. The strong reading, however, obviously runs counter to some deeply entrenched assumptions both in science and everyday life. Two seeds might be identical as far as we have been able to establish, yet we would be convinced that sooner or later a difference will be detected if we go on looking long enough. This is what our belief in what Klagge calls mediative causality comes down to. The question is whether we to think of this belief too as a case of groundless apriorism, as Wittgenstein seems to be suggesting? (This, by the way, is not how Klagge phrases the question.)

The book contains a number of other themes that I do not have the space to go into here. There is a chapter on the possibility of dialogue across culture gaps, and one on Wittgenstein's claim that the chain of reasons must come to an end somewhere; this is linked to the question whether the good is good because God wills it or whether God wills it because it is good; this interestingly leads on to a discussion of Job, Ivan Karamazov and Mormon piety.

In all, the book is a stimulating read. The thought experiments should give rise to good discussions in class. Klagge makes fruitful use of less-known Wittgenstein material, such as notes from his lectures.

However, one may question how useful the theme of exile is as a key to the reading of Wittgenstein. After all, what philosopher worth his or her salt is not in reality a kind of exile? One senses that the notion functions as a peg on which to hang a range of topics which otherwise would have made for two books or more. However, this does not diminish the fact that Klagge has important things to say on all the issues he raises.


Cockburn, David. 1995. "Responsibility and Necessity", Philosophy 70: 409-27.

Crary, Alice and Rupert Read (eds.). 2000. The New Wittgenstein. London & New York: Routledge.

Hacker, P. M. S. 2003. "Wittgenstein, Carnap and the New American Wittgensteinians", Philosophical Quarterly 53: 1-23.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1980. Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Vol I. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.