Wittgenstein in the 1930s: Between the Tractatus and the Investigations

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David G. Stern (ed.), Wittgenstein in the 1930s: Between the Tractatus and the Investigations, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 298pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108425872.

Reviewed by Anat Matar, Tel Aviv University


Recent years have seen a burst of interest in Wittgenstein's post-Tractarian writings, those which paved the way to Philosophical Investigations and the later notes written towards the end of Wittgenstein's life. The period that had gradually acquired the title "Middle Wittgenstein" has indeed attracted attention for several decades now; yet it seems that the particular surge of interest in recent years has to do with the intense debate, which culminated during the 1990s, around the unity of Wittgenstein's oeuvre. While interpreters who hold a "Two Wittgensteins" approach emphasize the differences in method and in content between the Tractatus and Philosophical Investigations, as well as Wittgenstein's explicit criticism of his former philosophical self, those who advocate a "One Wittgenstein" reading minimize the importance of these differences, stressing, rather, continuities, similarities and repetitions. Naturally, the Middle Wittgenstein has an important role to play in this dispute: a careful reading of the writings and lectures from the years 1929-1936 must she light on Wittgenstein's philosophical intentions, worries and methods, and therefore on his conception of the development of his own thought.

Yet despite the temptation, the book explicitly shuns discussiion of the "Two-or-One" dispute directly. This is a very wise decision: a declaration of independence, which bypasses the familiar interpretative terrain in order to start thinking of the Middle Wittgenstein afresh, without any prior partisanship -- or perhaps a slightly more critical attitude towards the "Two Wittgensteins" approach. As David G. Stern, the editor, explains in his Introduction:

Contributors to this collection include representatives of a number of very different approaches to Wittgenstein interpretation, address a wide range of themes and topics, and often make strong claims that are challengingly incompatible with the views of other contributors. Nevertheless, they generally agree that the old schematic interpretations on which those years were a time of "disintegration and reconstruction" in Wittgenstein's philosophical development are misleadingly simple, and that the truth is not only much more messy and complicated, but also much more interesting. (1)

In fact, these adjectives -- messy, complicated and interesting -- succinctly capture the character of the middle period in Wittgenstein's philosophical development and explain why it is so attractive. As we shall see, this character itself is a salient theme in the volume. For unlike the confidence and resoluteness characterizing both early and later stages of Wittgenstein's philosophy -- no matter how these are interpreted -- during the first half of the 1930s Wittgenstein oscillated between several, sometimes utterly opposite, methodological directions. Stern explains, somewhat apologetically: "In large part, this is because the 1930s were a period of rapid change for Wittgenstein. As a result, none of the publications from those years . . . has the settled and polished character of a fully finished work" (2). But I believe we should bear in mind that for Wittgenstein, throughout his life, philosophy was seen as "not a doctrine but an activity" (T, 4.112); and that in 1937 he avowed: "I find it important in philosophizing to keep changing my posture, not to stand for too long on one leg, so as not to get stiff. Like someone on a long up-hill climb who walks backwards for a while so as to revive himself and stretch some different muscles" (CV, 27). The fluctuations in the middle period thus seem to represent something that was essential to Wittgenstein -- in a way that is more faithful than in the early and later periods.

This philosophical unrest is exposed, analyzed and discussed throughout the book. The result is a fantastic example of what "philosophy as activity" actually means: a blessed anti-dogmatism and philosophical unease which yield moments of pure, genuine philosophy. The present volume, then, does a great service for Wittgenstein scholars and followers -- not only because of the depth and quality of the essays comprising it but also in reminding us what philosophy "as an activity" may mean. And it means, I believe, not only a constant inner movement but also a movement between clashing metaphilosophical points of departure, different interpretations and contrasts in philosophical temperament. In what follows I'll try to argue for this unique quality of the volume via several of the essays comprising it.

Section 3 of Stern's Introduction touches upon the above-mentioned interpretative debates and offers interesting insights about the way these are related to readings of the Middle Wittgenstein. Stern himself aligns with Volker Munz, Mauro Engelmann and others in emphasizing the distinctiveness of this philosophical stage, both in the issues developed and the method of discussing them; and he agrees with Hans Sluga and Robert Fogelin in acknowledging that "Wittgenstein was continually moving back and forth between proto-philosophical theorizing and Pyrrhonian criticism of such theories, not only in his middle period, but from first to last" (12). We need to recognize, Stern says, that "Wittgenstein felt the pull of both these impulses . . . throughout his life"; yet although this oscillation can be detected in every stage of his career, "it takes on a particularly central role in the transitional period", i.e., between 1929 and 1936-7. Later on, in his own contribution to the volume, Stern discusses Wittgenstein's calculus conception of grammar and G. E. Moore's attempts at understanding Wittgenstein's use of this term, 'grammar'. There's no point in summarizing Stern's delicate readings of these two philosophers here, but it is important to note that these readings are led by Stern's attention to the differences in the philosophical personalities of Moore and Wittgenstein. Temperament is not a frequent visitor in philosophical analyses, especially not those written within the analytic tradition. Here they come out as an indispensable perspective from which we should examine both philosophers' understanding of the Wittgensteinian notion of grammar.

Alois Pichler's "Wittgenstein on Understanding: Language, Calculus, and Practice" opens with a motto taken from Goethe's Faust, "Zwei Seelen wohnen, ach! In meiner Brust" (45), which echoes the volume's theme as I see it. Pichler's object of criticism is the "calculus approach", according to which in the early 1930s Wittgenstein held a conception of language as (at least somewhat) a calculus. Pichler holds that this interpretation is at best one sided, for it ignores the crucial dispute Wittgenstein stages, in the opening of the Big Typescript, between it and an opposite "anthropological approach". The calculus conception excludes from signification personal acts of meaning, half-understanding, half-sense, open-ended and vague meanings, etc. The anthropological approach, which appeals to human practice, rather than an ideal of exactness, acknowledges all these.

Throughout his philosophical career, Wittgenstein oscillated between on the one hand striving for and wanting to uphold some ideal of exactness, while on the other hand refusing to deny the presence and relevance of certain inexact, "amorphous" elements in human language and experience -- elements that did not fit into his striving for exactness. The question was always: How to relate those elements? (48)

Pichler charts some of the passages in which Wittgenstein explicitly tries to answer this question. He offers a delicate, meticulous reading of these passages and pays special attention to the role of the concept of understanding, examined through both approaches. Very appropriately, he discusses at some length Wittgenstein's comparison between the sense of a proposition and the meaning of a melody or theme. This significant topic recurs later in Anna Boncompagni's, Duncan Richter's and Hanne Appelqvist's contributions. Boncompagni looks at the same distinction, between language as calculus and a more vivid approach to it, tracking other changes in Wittgenstein's thought -- about use, intention and rule-following. Richter focuses on the similarities, in Wittgenstein, between ethics and aesthetics, as they took shape in the relevant period. And Appelqvist alludes to the comparison between propositions and musical themes as part of her convincing argument which urges us to link Wittgensteinian grammar with the kind of aesthetic judgment we find in Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgment.

Interestingly, Pichler counts out the option that Wittgenstein advanced, in his lectures from the 1930s, some kind of dialectic between different voices. Such a method is dependent on writing, he argues, whereas Wittgenstein's central tool in this period were his lectures. Rather than a plurality of voices, what we do have is a struggle between the calculus and the anthropological conceptions. Hence Wittgenstein's avowal (in TS-213,406r[1]) that the difficulty of philosophy is "not the intellectual difficulty of the sciences, but the difficulty of a change of attitude. Resistance of the will must be overcome". This conclusion leads to Pichler's own avowal: "Accordingly, this paper aims to bring to the fore not only Wittgenstein's intellectual struggle, but also his struggle of the will" (60).

James Klagge, too, deals with inner tensions in Wittgenstein's thought during the relevant period, but his focus is different: he links the famous so-called interlocutors -- different voices, troubling questions -- in the Philosophical Investigations to Wittgenstein's experience as a teacher. Klagge argues that once he began to teach, Wittgenstein came to realize that points of view contrary to his own were conceivable, and he "also began to think about what makes it difficult to change our philosophical views, which he attributed to temptations, inclinations, and other non-cognitive factors" (111). This is a refreshing suggestion, for two reasons. First, as Klagge rightly says, we don't usually think of Wittgenstein as someone who could have been open to influence; his strong and charismatic personality and his impatience for philosophical misunderstanding seem to yield an image of an impenetrable loner. Klagge does a fantastic job of digging up evidence which refutes this conception or at least reveals that things are much more complex in this respect. Secondly, Klagge, like Pichler, reminds us of Wittgenstein's recognition that the difficulty of philosophy is "not the intellectual difficulty of the sciences, but the difficulty of a change of attitude. Resistances of the will must be overcome" (119, quoting from the Big Typescript). Once we bear this in mind we may understand Wittgenstein's "transition from esotericism to evangelism" (118).

William Child's contribution deals with the Middle Wittgenstein's conceptions of personal experience and focuses on the philosophical treatment of 'I' and the Self. These are topics which concerned Wittgenstein especially in the early 1930s. There is neither polyphony nor struggle of the will here, but there is an abundance of layers and nuance. Child analyzes various distinctions Wittgenstein makes among uses of 'I' in his 1933 lectures and shows that these result from the variety of questions Wittgenstein poses and from his appeal to different philosophical tools (phenomenological description, attention to ordinary use, analogies, etc.). He finds several bits of Wittgenstein's reasoning persuasive and other parts unconvincing. Moving on to the Blue Book, Child draws another set of differences -- between uses of 'I' in the text and also between various interpretations of them. Surprisingly, this richness concludes with sameness: Child claims that the distinction between the use of 'I' as subject and its use as object, as it is drawn in the Blue Book, survives in Philosophical Investigations, despite the fact that Wittgenstein abandons these terms themselves.

Part III, which is dedicated to religion, ethics and aesthetics, includes, in addition to Richter's and Appelqvist's articles which were already mentioned, those of Anat Biletzki and Joachim Schulte. Writing about the contexts in which Wittgenstein spoke about religion, Biletzki starts from problematizing the term 'context' itself, charts the different relevant contexts and various ways of approaching Wittgenstein's intentions when using religious terms, and then offers a reading of parts of Moore's notes that discuss religion. Her conclusion chimes with the volume's implicit theme: she convincingly argues for a reading of Wittgenstein's treatment of the relation between the notions of God, religion and grammar as work in progress, or indeed, philosophy in motion.

The case of aesthetics is paradigmatic for the kind of approach I detect in the whole volume (and the Middle Wittgenstein). The point is raised in Appelqvist's article, and is made very strongly in Schulte's contribution. Schulte starts his article on Wittgenstein's remarks on aesthetics by discussing the (largely unacknowledged) influence Goethe and Spengler exerted on his philosophy. He then moves on to emphasize this salient characteristic:

what Wittgenstein calls an aesthetic or mathematical problem does not involve causality and is therefore not amenable to explanations of the causal kind. What it requires is a kind of treatment which helps us to arrive at a useful description -- a description that permits us to see things in a way which can assist us in finding a solution to the problem at hand. (229)

Schulte correctly points out that the reason Wittgenstein reflected on aesthetic matters in relation to Frazer and Freud has to do with his interest in the scientistic conflation of reasons and causes, which eliminates "something that's important". Freud is better than Frazer, in this respect, because alongside his reductionist scientific explanations, he does attempt to give non-causal explanations of phenomena that most people would try to account for in causal terms (233). Instead, Freud makes us "see puzzles where the unassisted eye would fail to notice them"; "And the tendency to overlook the puzzling side of phenomena can result in misidentifications of these phenomena, that is, in failing to see their true nature and significance" (234). Schulte wraps up his argument by coming back to Goethe and Spengler's morphological approach and linking it to this latter insight and the descriptive method in general. What makes this linkage possible, he shows, is Wittgenstein's remarkable openness to circumscribable influences during the middle-period.

The volume ends with a two-chapter "dialogue" on Wittgenstein's philosophy of mathematics in the relevant years. While Warren Goldfarb emphasizes Wittgenstein's interest in mathematical induction during the early 1930s as continuing a Tractarian line of thought, Mathieu Marion and Mitsuhiro Okada instead emphasize the distance between Wittgenstein's approach and his former self. Both articles, though, contribute to the volume's successful attempt to read the Middle Wittgenstein as producing a fascinating philosophical corpus rather than merely a transitory one.