Wittgenstein: Key Concept

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Kelly Dean Jolley (ed.), Wittgenstein: Key Concepts, Acumen, 2010, 214pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651894.

Reviewed by J. Jeremy Wisnewski, Hartwick College


The collection of essays in Wittgenstein: Key Concepts seems to reflect two goals. The first is captured by the title of the series to which the collection belongs ("Key Concepts"). According to the publisher,

the Key Concepts series brings the work of the most influential philosophers and social theorists to a new generation of readers. Each volume is structured by the central ideas or concepts in a thinker's work, with each chapter in a volume explaining an individual concept and exploring its application.

A collection such as this also aims to achieve a second goal: to be of interest to those already familiar with Wittgenstein. Achieving both goals, of course, is a difficult task. A satisfactory introduction often has to sacrifice depth of analysis for accessibility, and texts designed to give the rough terrain of a thinker's work usually don't have the specialist in mind as a target audience.

Despite this difficulty, the contributors in this volume usually meet these opposing goals rather well. None of the essays are technically difficult, and they are usually rich enough to make reading them well worth any effort (and time) they may require. This alone merits giving serious consideration to adopting a book like Wittgenstein: Key Concepts for classroom use. The collection is pedagogical in the best sense of the term. The essays aim not just to bring to light the central themes and 'key concepts' in Wittgenstein's corpus, but also to explore these topics in sometimes novel ways. The book certainly rivals, in my view, the collections of secondary material on Wittgenstein found in, for example, The Cambridge Companion to Wittgenstein (a collection with much to recommend it). It surpasses a great many other collections, the titles of which, for politeness' sake, I will leave to the reader's imagination.

The 'key concepts' explored include meaning-blindness, family resemblance, the private-language 'argument', rule-following, the claim that the standard meter is not a meter (Philosophical Investigations [PI] §50), grammatical investigation, and the nature of Wittgenstein's writing. Kelly Dean Jolley has also provided a thoughtful introduction that explores both central ideas in Wittgenstein and also the disagreements about how to understand these ideas. Despite being a collection of essays on different concepts, the essays do have some thematic unity. The notion that Wittgenstein's project is best understood therapeutically, for instance, recurs in several essays, and not merely those boasting the same authors (more on this in a moment).

Which essays will most profit any single reader in a collection such as this a matter of idiosyncrasy. Like Wittgenstein's work itself, the force of any particular essay depends on the particular philosophical assumptions one labors under. This is entirely appropriate in a volume that continuously reminds its readers of Wittgenstein's therapeutic intent. This dimension of Wittgenstein is explored both explicitly -- by Phil Hutchinson and Rupert Read in "Therapy", as well as by Read in "Ordinary/everyday language" -- and implicitly -- by several essays that take seriously Wittgenstein's claim that there are no theses in philosophy (PI §127) and hence that Wittgenstein does not intend to offer theories of meaning, mind, or anything else (see chapters by Craig Fox, Heather Gert, Hutchinson, Avner Baz, et al.).

The claim that these essays are 'idiosyncratically beneficial,' I want to emphasize, is not to be taken as any kind of disparagement. The claim reflects a reality -- namely, that different readers of Wittgenstein suffer different kinds of obsessions (or are in different fly bottles, if you like). Essays that challenge our obsessions, our readings and misreadings, are certainly more valuable than those which simply reinforce views we already hold.

I want to turn my attention to the substance of a couple of the essays in the collection, but always bearing in mind that these essays challenged my settled convictions about what Wittgenstein is up to, and did so profitably (and hence bearing in mind that other essays might be more profitable to others). I do not mean to neglect any of the authors in this collection. As I've already noted, I believe the entire collection is worth one's time, and that it is accessible enough to introduce students to some of the larger debates in the secondary literature on Wittgenstein.

Gert's essay, "Knowing that the standard metre is one metre long" is one essay that profitably challenged my reading of Wittgenstein's famous remark at PI §50 (referenced in Gert's title and above). Gert separates responses to Wittgenstein's claim into two camps: those who assert that Wittgenstein's claim is false, on the one hand, and those who claim that it is true, on the other. She then proceeds to dispute what both camps presuppose: namely, that it is Wittgenstein who is actually asserting the view in question (namely, that the standard metre cannot be said to be one metre). Despite being a long-time member of the camp that thinks Wittgenstein is right in thinking that a thing cannot be a criterion of itself, and hence that a standard metre, qua standard, cannot actually be the measure of itself without presupposing some other standard, I found Gert's approach to the issue thoughtful and interesting. I'm nearly certain Gert has changed my mind about this topic (as peculiar as that might sound to non-Wittgensteinians, I hope it won't sound so peculiar to those who have profitably struggled through the Investigations). I'm still convinced that the sympathetic reading of the 'metre claim' gets something right about Wittgenstein -- which Gert need not deny -- but Gert has also presented a powerful case against reading PI §50 as evidence for the view it is sometimes used to support (by Robert Fogelin, for example). The example, Gert plausibly and carefully argues, is meant to call into question our tendencies toward the absolute (the philosopher's tendency to say "x can never be y", or that "x must be the case"). Gert does this by placing the remark in context, examining the surrounding examples and their intended functional similarity to the metre claim and usefully noting the way these similar examples should generate very similar conclusions.

Read's essay on "Ordinary/everyday language" is likewise both challenging and profitable, albeit for very different reasons. This essay usefully argues that Wittgenstein is not to be read as an ordinary language philosopher and, indeed, that the very notion of 'everyday language' should be understood as including scientific (and other specialized) language to the extent that this language-use does not venture into myth (Read's term). Read provocatively claims that "'the everyday' is not counterposed to science. It is 'counterposed' only to metaphysics, to myth -- to decorated and attractive forms of nothing … For the contrast-class to the everyday is only: lived delusion" (69). Read argues that this way of understanding the everyday prevents us from reducing Wittgenstein to anti-science guru, to ordinary language philosopher, and also to proto-positivist. What is most useful in his essay, though, is his continual emphasis that the underlying point of the category of the everyday is intimately linked to Wittgenstein's therapeutic aim. This allows Read to ask some difficult questions about his own writing (is it nonsense or everyday language?) and to give an appropriately nuanced reply (ultimately, say what you like about this kind of philosophical language, the point is to know what one is saying).

There are several other essays that deserve as much attention as I have given to Gert's and Read's chapters. Sadly, space constraints make this impossible. Fox's essay on family resemblance, I think, is both subtle and persuasive. Baz, likewise, offers a nuanced view of the difficulty in understanding Wittgenstein's reflections on aspect perception. Hutchinson's chapter "Thinking and understanding" is likewise superb. But to reiterate: there is no dearth of worthwhile material in this book.

I'll end with a small complaint. For all of the talk of 'key concepts,' a good deal of this book claims to contest something called the 'standard reading' of Wittgenstein. I suspect that this is something of a straw man nowadays. At one point, a dominant understanding of Wittgenstein was as positivist (early) and post-positivist (late). While the uninitiated sometimes (often?) do have this view still, it strikes me as no longer 'standard' (other than as a foil) among working scholars of Wittgenstein. But this is just a quibble. Foils are useful, after all -- particularly when trying to flesh out a nuanced view of a thinker like Wittgenstein. Seeing how not to read Wittgenstein is as important as seeing how to read him (two things that are probably, at bottom, one and the same).