Wittgenstein: Lectures, Cambridge 1930-1933: From the Notes of G. E. Moore

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David Stern, Brian Rogers, and Gabriel Citron (eds.), Wittgenstein: Lectures, Cambridge 1930-1933: From the Notes of G. E. Moore, Cambridge University Press, 2016, lxxiv + 420pp., $116.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107041165.

Reviewed by Thomas Baldwin, University of York


Wittgenstein returned to Cambridge in January 1929 to work on the foundations of mathematics with F. P. Ramsey, and despite their disagreements they worked together until Ramsey's unexpected death at the start of 1930. During 1929 Wittgenstein also gave some talks and at the end of the year he was invited by the Cambridge Moral Sciences faculty to give some lectures on philosophy. At this time the faculty comprised just two Professors (G. E. Moore and W. R. Sorley) and two lecturers (W. E. Johnson and C. D. Broad); so additional lectures were very welcome. Thus began Wittgenstein's courses of lectures on philosophy at Cambridge which ran, with some interruptions, from January 1930 until May 1936.

This new volume comprises an edition of Moore's notes on Wittgenstein's lectures from January 1930 until May 1933. Moore had known Wittgenstein well when Wittgenstein was in Cambridge during 1912-1914, and had even visited him in Norway in April 1914. But soon after this visit Moore broke off contact with Wittgenstein after Wittgenstein angrily blamed him for the refusal by the Cambridge authorities to award him a B.A. on the basis of the work on logic, and the separation between them was then extended until after the war and Wittgenstein's subsequent withdrawal from philosophy. So the two of them had not met again until, fifteen years later, they found each other by chance on the train from London to Cambridge which brought Wittgenstein back to Cambridge in January 1929. They soon found that they were able to resume their friendship and established the practice of meeting for discussion every week. By this time Moore was Professor of Philosophy at Cambridge and editor of Mind, and as such recognised as one of the pre-eminent British philosophers. But in his 1942 autobiography Moore wrote that when they re-established contact he found, just as he had earlier, that Wittgenstein 'has made me think that what is required for the solution of philosophical problems which baffle me, is a method which he himself uses successfully, but which I have never been able to understand clearly enough to use it myself'. (The Philosophy of G. E. Moore ed. P. A. Schillp, Open Court, La Salle ILL, p. 33).

What is important for this volume is that, in addition to their private meetings, from January 1930 Moore began to attend most of Wittgenstein's lectures and the associated discussion classes (in providing these classes Wittgenstein was following Moore's practice of providing a discussion class to follow up his weekly lectures). Moore took extensive notes at the lectures, though not at the discussion classes, and by the time he stopped attending in May 1933 he had filled six notebooks. Moore's notes end there because at the start of the next academic year Wittgenstein modified his method of teaching, deciding to meet regularly with just a small group of students to whom he dictated the notes known as 'The Blue Book'. Moore did not attend these meetings, and although he did attend some of Wittgenstein's subsequent classes, he does not appear to have taken any notes at them. At first Moore's notes are brief and telegraphic, but as Moore becomes more skilled at capturing Wittgenstein's words his notes become much fuller, and the notes for the lectures given in the academic year 1932-33 are especially extensive. This is partly because Moore was taking more notes at each lecture, but also because during this year Wittgenstein's weekly discussion classes became in effect a second lecture so that Moore took notes at them as well.

Moore never explained why he was taking his notes, but he does report that Wittgenstein expressed his confidence in Moore's practice, saying that 'he was glad I was taking notes, since, if anything were to happen to him, they would contain some record of the results of his thinking' (Moore 1954 p. 4). This comment comes from the three-part paper based on his notebooks which Moore wrote after Wittgenstein's death, 'Wittgenstein's Lectures in 1930-1933' (Part I, Mind 63 (1954) pp. 1-15; Part II, Mind 63 (1954) pp. 289-316; Part III, Mind 64 (1955) pp. 1-27). Moore here describes the main themes of Wittgenstein's lectures in considerable detail, but largely in his own terms; and much the same point applies to the two other books based on notes from these lectures: that edited by Desmond Lee, which is based on his own notes and those of John King on Wittgenstein's lectures from January 1930 until June 1932 (Wittgenstein's Lectures, Cambridge: 1930-32, Blackwell, Oxford 1980), and that edited by Alice Ambrose, which is based on her notes and those of Margaret MacDonald on Wittgenstein's lectures and classes from October 1932 until June 1935 (Wittgenstein's Lectures, Cambridge: 1932-35, Blackwell, Oxford 1979). Thus although, prior to this volume, there was a good deal of information about Wittgenstein's lectures, the lectures themselves were not available.

It is this gap which is filled by the present volume. For what makes this volume special is that, as Moore himself put it: 'I tried to get down in my notes the actual words he used' (Moore 1954 p. 5), though Moore adds 'I cannot possibly do justice to the extreme richness of illustration and comparison which he used'. Thus Moore's notes, especially those from October 1930 onwards, are as close to a transcription of a recording of Wittgenstein's lectures as we can get. They are of course not based on any notes supplied by Wittgenstein himself, for, as Moore remarks, Wittgenstein 'never read his lectures; he had not, in fact, written them out, although he always spent a great deal of time in thinking out what he proposed to say' (Moore 1954 p. 5). The result is that there is an immediacy to Moore's notes which is quite unlike the accounts of the lectures by Lee, King, Ambrose and MacDonald, and indeed Moore's own later description of them. The editors have very sensibly not attempted to modify Moore's notes (though they provide footnotes of their own to clarify points that are unclear). They also provide photographs of four typical pages from Moore's notebooks which show what Moore's notebooks look like; and they have arranged for good quality scans of Moore's notebooks to be accessible online from the Bergen Wittgenstein archive, so that readers can check any points where the text seems odd (throughout their edition the editors provide marginal references to the page numbers of Moore's notebooks).

Wittgenstein's lectures connect closely with his writings at this time. The early lectures in 1930 provided him with material for his Philosophical Remarks, which he composed in March and April 1930 in order to support his successful application for a Senior Research Fellowship at Trinity College. The next group of lectures from 1930-31 has many similarities with the first draft of The Big Typescript, which was written during the winter months of 1931-2; and the Philosophical Grammar, although based on the early chapters of The Big Typescript, also incorporates revisions in the light of the 1932-33 lectures. There are, however, important differences, both in style and content between these texts and the lectures. In particular the three texts were of course written in German and are based on Wittgenstein's manuscript books, whereas the lectures were delivered in English and, as Moore says, had not been written out in advance. So Moore's notes capture Wittgenstein's ways of expressing his philosophical thoughts in English in a way which is not replicated in the texts that Wittgenstein prepared himself.

This is not the place to offer a detailed account of my own of Wittgenstein's lectures, but some salient points can be briefly presented here. An obvious place to start is with his attitude to the positions he had advanced in Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (TLP). He begins his first lecture in January 1930 by briskly setting aside traditional debates concerning the foundations of knowledge as 'irrelevant to science and life', and turns instead to the task of getting clear about 'the use of language', which takes him to a discussion of propositions, which, he says, work by 'being a picture of reality' (p. 5). All of this is reminiscent of TLP, and there are other similar points in these early lectures: 'logical form', he says, provides for the harmony between thought and reality (p. 20), logical concepts such as 'cardinal number' and 'colour' are 'pseudo-concepts' which are best regarded as characterising distinct kinds of variable (p. 24), a priori propositions say nothing but show something (p. 30), and 'p is possible' is a pseudo-proposition which means "p" has sense (p. 33). But there are also new themes in these first lectures: one concerns the role of verification -- 'the sense of a proposition is the way in which it is verified' (p. 20); and this role is amplified by a distinction between propositions and hypotheses: a hypothesis such as "this is a piece of chalk" is 'a law by means of which propositions are constructed', whereas propositions such as "this looks like a piece of chalk" are 'equivalent to a method of verifying or falsifying' (p. 44). Another new theme concerns grammar, his generalisation of TLP's conception of 'logical grammar': grammar is the system of rules of language which characterise what makes sense, and as such grammar is 'a portrait of reality; but not like a picture of a man' (p. 51); furthermore, it is 'unjustifiable by means of language' (p. 51) since any attempt to justify it would require consideration of alternative possibilities which it itself declares to be nonsense.

In subsequent lectures Wittgenstein breaks much more decisively from his earlier position. Although it is a mark of propositions that they have a logical form (p. 113) this is no longer the key to the harmony between thought and reality. Instead this is just a matter of there being something in common which is shown by the way in which thoughts about reality are expressed, but which cannot itself be described (p. 92); hence saying that "A proposition is a picture" is 'misleading' (p. 142). In TLP the conception of propositions as pictures was associated with the theory of elementary propositions and truth-functions, and concerning these topics Wittgenstein comments: 'Here I've had to change my opinions most' (p. 139) and there is much discussion of these changes in the lectures. One 'deeper mistake' was that of 'confusing logical analysis, with chemical analysis' (p. 217). Chemical analysis is based on the genuine phenomenon of the fundamental atomic structure of chemical compounds; but there is no similar fundamental logical structure of complex propositions -- 'I was wrong in supposing that it had any sense to talk of result of final analysis' (p. 253). So although logical analysis has a role in philosophy as a way of removing muddles, it cannot give us the 'complete grammar' of a word; for there is no complete grammar (p. 266). In thinking that this is possible we are misled by superficial similarities among the parts of language. These similarities are like those among the handles one finds in the cab of an engine, when the truth is that these handles have very different functions; similarly, 'What we do with our words in different cases has no similarity at all' (p. 253; cf. Philosophical Investigations (PI) ยง12).

It is in these lectures that we first encounter the concept which is central to much of Wittgenstein's later philosophy -- that of a language-game; he first uses the term in February 1933, remarking that 'Looking at language-games is awfully helpful to understand language and logic' (p. 256). In fact the comparison between games and language goes right back to his first lectures in March 1930, when he says 'Rules of a game are like grammar in a way: rules of chess allow certain moves, & of grammar allow substitutions' (p. 28); but he adds here 'Language differs from a game, in its application to reality' (p. 28).

As his later introduction of the term 'language-game' indicates, however, in the course of the lectures he becomes much more concerned to emphasize the ways in which our uses of language enter into our activities than to separate language off because of its descriptive use (pp. 256-8). The key concept is that of a rule: just as the rules of chess are arbitrary, but constitute the game, the rules of grammar are arbitrary but constitute the meaning of the words governed by these rules (p. 180) by determining how they are properly used (p. 308). One important component of these rules concerns the evidence for a proposition; when discussing Russell's scepticism about the reality of the past Wittgenstein comments 'In all these cases we are asking for evidence, & pointing out that giving evidence is giving grammar' (p. 296). Rules for use which constitute meaning can also be guides for action, and Wittgenstein likes to model this aspect of understanding a word on understanding a sign such as an arrow. Thus he says 'It has no sense to say "I follow" the arrow, unless I act according to it in one particular way, as opposed to another' (p. 135). He then continues, in a way which looks forward to his later discussions of rule-following: 'You might say: It is not enough to give grammar of arrow, you have also to give rule of translation. But this is not so. . . . Do you need another rule to tell you how to translate this? It would lead to an infinite regress = it gets you no further' (p. 135). Finally, in a lecture of June 1931 he sketches a version of the argument, familiar from its later occurrence in The Blue Book (p. 3), against the view that understanding the order 'make a red mark' requires one first to form a visual image of red. Wittgenstein's objection to this requirement is here reported as follows: 'You can't & needn't imagine imagining red' (p. 154), but Moore's notes seem very compressed at this point (which comes right at the end of his notes for the lectures given in 1931), and the editors have added a note by Moore himself in which, surely relying on his memory of Wittgenstein's words, Moore spells out the point more fully: 'In order to carry out the order "Imagine a red spot", you don't need to imagine imagining a red spot . . . Hence in order to carry out "Paint a red spot" you don't need to imagine a red spot'.

These comments deal with only a small selection from the rich variety of issues Wittgenstein discusses in his lectures, and I have concentrated so far on points that connect with TLP and PI. This approach provides an easy way into the lectures, but, as the editors point out in their introduction (pp. xliii ff.), it would be a mistake to assume that there is a teleology inherent in the evolution of Wittgenstein's thought such that the lectures are to be regarded primarily as transitional works rather than considered on their own. However, one should also to bear in mind that the lectures are not finished pieces of work but expressions of the development of his thought during the early 1930's. So they are best regarded as a resource for understanding his 'middle' philosophy, the nexus of positions he articulates during the 1930's.

In discussing them, I have concentrated so far on issues concerning logic and language, and this may give the impression that in these lectures Wittgenstein deals only with these topics. But while he acknowledges that 'our investigations are about language, and about puzzles that arise from use of language' (p. 317), he insists that the investigations are not about the meaning of "meaning", but deal with 'troubles arising in our thought from a particular use of language' (p. 260). There are several examples of this in the 1932-33 lectures. In the Lent Term 1933 lectures he enters into an extended discussion of the ways in which we talk about sensations such as tooth-ache, where he focuses on the differences between first-person and third-person uses. His discussions of the 'puzzles that arise from <our> use of language' in this area are too complicated for me to attempt to describe them here, but they certainly merit careful attention, and not merely as a prelude to his other writings on this subject. Another significant feature of these later lectures is the attention given to the distinction between causes and reasons as answers to the question 'Why?'. In November 1932 he applies this first to obviously rational actions, such as calculations and moves in a game of chess (pp. 196-7), before applying it to voluntary action generally, introducing the famous question of the difference between 'I lifted my arm' and 'My arm went up' and suggesting that the mark of voluntary actions is that the answer to a 'why?' question gives the agent's reason (p. 201).

At the end of the May 1933 lectures Wittgenstein extends this account of the significance of the distinction between causes and reasons in the context of a critical discussion of the use of psychology to explain (or 'explain away' as Wittgenstein puts it [p. 357]) practices and judgments which are better understood by the use of a 'descriptive method' (p. 331) which focuses on reasons, not causes. He applies this point to Frazer's discussions of rituals, Freud's analyses of jokes, and aesthetic debates about ideals of beauty and taste. Thus in the case of rituals such the Beltane ritual which Frazer describes, he suggests that what satisfies us is 'simply describing lots of things more or less like Beltane' (p. 352), so that we can find a pattern comparable, say, to patterns in types of music that we like -- e.g. that they start from tonic, go to dominant, and then return to tonic (p. 353). It is then these patterns or ideals which provide reasons for anthropological understanding and aesthetic judgment, and, he suggests, much the same applies to Freud's ways of making sense of puzzling behaviour such as laughter: 'The confusion between getting to know the cause & the reason for laughing, has caused the extremely pernicious effect which psychoanalysis has had . . . It's because what Freud says sounds as if it were science, but is in fact a wonderful representation' (p. 365).

These remarks about the significance and structure of reasons lead to some indications of his conception of philosophy at this time. When emphasising the importance of reasons for understanding thought and action, he remarks that 'the chain of reasons comes to an end: & yet they're no less reasons', and he continues: 'There is pernicious idea that if you don't give a reason, there must be something wrong. But when a reason has been given for something, we could ask: What reason was there for this reason, but you needn't' (p. 210). So the emphasis on the importance of reasons does not bring a commitment to rationalist metaphysics; indeed he comments 'The superstition of saying "This is rational" is deeply rooted' (p. 210). In the later lectures he confronts the question which then arises as to why one is attracted to the ideals and patterns which provide the reasons that inform one's judgments. He allows that one might offer a causal explanation at this point; but he comments: 'You may call this Psychology, if you like. But it is Natural History of Man' (p. 355). So he affirms here a kind of naturalism, which one can perhaps associate with some of his later comments about forms of life (though this is not a phrase that he uses in these lectures). But he also speaks here of the way in which use of the descriptive method makes 'a synopsis possible' which provides an answer to puzzles in aesthetics and philosophy (p. 358). He has not in fact said anything detailed here about the application of this method to philosophy, but in an earlier lecture from November 1930 he uses this terminology in a way which is revealing: he says that the aim of philosophy should be to remove intellectual discomfort by showing that 'we were wrong to ask questions', and the only way to show this is 'by synopsis of many trivialities' (p. 87). So here a descriptive method is recommended, though rather different from that which is suggested as applicable in aesthetics.

I could go on to further topics, but I hope I have said enough to show that this volume is a treasure chest. Moore's notes bring Wittgenstein's genius before us by inviting us to listen to his lectures and encounter the intensity of his thought before its brilliance has been disciplined by the carefully organised dialectic one finds in his famous works. The editors have done a tremendous job in resurrecting Moore's notes and thereby enhancing the availability of Wittgenstein's middle philosophy.