Wittgenstein on Logic as the Method of Philosophy: Re-examining the Roots and Development of Analytic Philosophy

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Oskari Kuusela, Wittgenstein on Logic as the Method of Philosophy: Re-examining the Roots and Development of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2019, 297pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198829751.

Reviewed by David G. Stern, University of Iowa


Questions about how best to understand Wittgenstein's methods have been a focus of debate in recent work on his philosophy, both early and late. One central axis of disagreement among interpreters turns on precisely this issue. "Two Wittgensteins" interpreters draw a basic distinction between the early and the later philosophy, as they hold that his methods in the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations are deeply different. "One Wittgenstein" interpreters, on the other hand, maintain that the early and the later Wittgenstein have a great deal in common, and that the methods of the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations are fundamentally similar, or even identical. Oskari Kuusela's book is an original and thought-provoking defense of a novel position in the middle ground between these polarized extremes. He argues that both sides in this long-running debate have misunderstood key parts of Wittgenstein's philosophy, both early and late.

At first sight, the book's title, a telegraphic summary of its main line of argument, may lead the reader whose outlook has been formed by this debate to expect a defense of a unitary "one Wittgenstein" account, on which logic is at the core of Wittgenstein's method, both early and late. While they would not be entirely wrong, the introduction already makes it clear that Kuusela's aims are both more ambitious, and more subtle, than the title implies, or such a quick and simple summary suggests. The book's ambitions are set out at the very beginning, where we are told that

This book, in essence, is an examination of Frege's and Russell's methodological and logical ideas and their further development and transformation by certain other philosophers, especially Ludwig Wittgenstein, but also Rudolf Carnap and Peter Strawson. It is in this sense a book on methodology in analytic philosophy. And although the book assumes the form of the examination of the history of analytic philosophy, especially the work of Wittgenstein, it is just as much -- or more -- about the future of analytic philosophy. (p. 1)

If Peter Hacker hadn't already called his own book on this topic Wittgenstein's Place in Twentieth-Century Analytic Philosophy, something very similar could have been the perfect title for this book. However, Kuusela's unitary interpretation of Wittgenstein's conception of logic is very different from Hacker's "two Wittgensteins" account. According to Hacker, the early Wittgenstein offers a positive account of the nature of logic while the later Wittgenstein's contribution to logic is at best negative, primarily consisting in a critique of the methods of Frege, Russell, and the Tractatus in particular, and calculus-based methods in general. On this traditional and still widely accepted approach, while the early Wittgenstein accepted and modified Frege's and Russell's use of formal methods, the later Wittgenstein advocated "the view that we should stick to the employment and description of everyday or natural language in philosophy, perhaps for the purpose of some kind of philosophical therapy" (p. 3). It is striking that even among those who, influenced by the work of Cora Diamond, advocate a resolute reading, on which the unity of Wittgenstein's philosophy early and late consists in its therapeutic, anti-theoretical orientation, there is a growing recognition that there are significant discontinuities within this broader continuity, and that they have to do with Wittgenstein's changing conception of the nature of logic and its role in his philosophical methodology.

In opposition to both traditional and resolute interpreters of the Tractatus, Kuusela argues that the aim of the Tractatus is neither to express positive insights about logic by way of nonsensical theses, nor to therapeutically dissolve any positive views about the nature of logic, but rather to introduce a notation that provides the proper expression of his logical insights. Given this starting point, he then articulates an interpretation of the later philosophy as a revision and extension of Wittgenstein's earlier positive contribution to philosophical logic. Kuusela maintains that the red thread that runs through Wittgenstein's writing from first to last is his work as "a philosopher of logic and a supporter of the Fregean-Russellian conception of philosophy as a logical investigation" (p. 4). As Kuusela tells this story, Wittgenstein not only began his work in philosophy as a supporter of Russell's and Frege's approaches to logic in particular, and philosophy in general, but retained that orientation in his later work, even as he made some changes and added some new techniques.

The first chapter discusses the nature of Wittgenstein's inheritance of Frege's and Russell's new logic, and the promise of philosophical progress that it offered. The second chapter makes the case that the Tractatus "assumes and builds on the Russellian conception of philosophical problems as logical ones, to be solved by means of logical methods" (p. 4) but aims to resolve problems within their accounts of logic, such as questions about the status of logical laws and the nature of logic. Chapter three addresses the relationship between the Tractarian philosophy of logic and Carnap's, and contends that the differences between them are not as large as most commentators have thought, while also acknowledging that they are significant and substantial.

The fourth chapter turns to the crucial question of the relationship between the Tractarian conception of logic and Wittgenstein's later thoughts on the topic, arguing that the change is best understood as an expansion and modification of the earlier views, rather than a wholesale rejection of them, but that this nevertheless amounts to "reconceiv[ing] and transform[ing] the Tractatus' philosophy of logic" (p. 10). Crucially, Kuusela argues that this reconception and transformation turns on Wittgenstein's developing a new account of logical idealization. From this perspective, the calculus-based methods that occupy center stage in the Tractatus can be seen as one of several logical methodologies, augmented by a few new logical methods that are introduced in the 1930s. These new methods include the use of language-games as a method of logic (the topic of chapter five), and the role of natural history in logic, in what Kuusela describes as Wittgenstein's "non-empiricist naturalism" (chapter six). Nevertheless, Kuusela also acknowledges that this overarching continuity contains within it a great deal of change and discontinuity. For instance, the Tractarian conception of language as an ideal abstract entity is rejected, to be replaced by an emphasis on the implications of the fact that "language is a spatial and temporal phenomenon", and "the multifaceted phenomena of language we know from everyday life" (p. 109). Indeed, Kuusela stresses that "Wittgenstein later described himself as engaged in a grammatical rather than a logical investigation" (p. 6) and this change in Wittgenstein's preferred terminology has undoubtedly contributed to the perception that he was not doing the same kind of work on logic in the Investigations as in the Tractatus. Kuusela, on the other hand, replies that Wittgenstein's later approach

can answer to the kinds of needs in response to which, for example, Aristotle, Frege, and Russell developed their logics. If it can do this, this is a reason to regard it as a contribution to logic -- irrespective of whether we call it 'logic', 'grammar', or something else. This question now emerges as merely terminological. (p. 8)

It is at this point, if not before, that the apparently clear distinction between a one-Wittgenstein and a two-Wittgenstein account with which we began starts to seem more than a little blurred. At what point does reconceiving and transforming an old view become indistinguishable from rejecting it? Kuusela's reply to such questions is to describe the relationship between Wittgenstein's early and later philosophy as akin to a "Kuhnian paradigm shift" (p. 143): while the latter "is able to handle the cases that Fregean-Russellian logic can handle, it can also deal with further cases that the Fregean-Russellian logic cannot" (p. 143). However, the appeal to the slippery notion of a paradigm shift does not so much solve the problem as draw further attention to it. For in almost every example that has been proposed as an illustration of such a shift, it has proven controversial both whether all the problem-solving capacities of the earlier theory are preserved in the later theory (often given the name of "Kuhn-loss"), and whether the conceptual resources offered by the new theory that underwrite the additional problem-solving are compatible with those of the earlier theory (the issue of commensurability). In other words, Kuusela's solution to the dispute between those who see two very different Wittgensteins at work in the early and the later philosophy and those who see just one -- namely to argue that there is one single program of logical clarification that unifies his work, but that it undergoes a paradigm shift -- starts to look more like a version of a two Wittgensteins interpretation. On the other hand, if Kuusela is right that Wittgenstein's later methods can be added to his earlier methods, so that new cases can be handled, then his interpretation looks more like a one Wittgenstein view.

This is a rich and complex book that anyone seriously interested in the development of Wittgenstein's philosophy will want to read, and in the space of a brief review such as this I can only touch on a few of the leading issues that it raises. My own reservations about Kuusela's interpretation are not primarily over any of the details of his impressive and ambitious account of the relationship between the earlier work on logic and the later discussions of grammar. Instead, they concern his claim that the later philosophy as a whole, and the Philosophical Investigations in particular, should be read "as a positive contribution to the philosophy of logic." It is true that there is a great deal of discussion of grammar in his later writing that can, taken in isolation, be read in this way. But it is striking that the Philosophical Investigations repeatedly raises questions about whether these discussions of grammar do lead to any positive contribution over and above the clearing away of misunderstandings.

I am inclined to approach the "positive contribution" that Kuusela attributes to the author of the Investigations as another way of talking about what Stanley Cavell first called the "voice of correctness", which is just one voice in the dialogues that run through that book. Wittgenstein's own views, I believe, are much closer to those of the narratorial voice that often concludes the exchanges that run through the book, and the narrator's primarily negative, Pyrrhonian conclusions are often diametrically opposed to the positive views proposed by the voices of correctness. For this reason, even though Kuusela's use of quotations from Wittgenstein's Nachlass in support of his claim that the later philosophy can best be seen as a positive contribution to the philosophy of logic is wide-ranging, thoughtful, and well-informed, I found it less than persuasive. They certainly show us that Wittgenstein explored the views that Kuusela attributes to Wittgenstein, but they hardly settle the question whether he ultimately endorsed them.

Kuusela concludes his introduction with a brief discussion of exegetical method and the dangers of putting too much weight on Wittgenstein's papers rather than his most polished works, noting that

the exegetical method used in this book involves the employment of Wittgenstein's notebooks, manuscripts, typescripts, and lecture notes as an aid in the interpretation of his remarks in the Tractatus and the Investigations. Wittgenstein's Nachlass thus plays a supportive, albeit very important, role in the task of interpretation. But ultimately the Nachlass is only an aid in reading the two more authoritative works that Wittgenstein himself completed or almost completed. To be sure, the Nachlass cannot automatically solve any problems of interpreting these books, and caution must be exercised by paying attention to the context of remarks to ensure the legitimacy of their employment for relevant purposes. . . . Wittgenstein himself seems to also have acknowledged the legitimacy of such an employment of his literary remains: 'I believe it might interest a philosopher, one who can think himself, to read my notes. For even if I have hit the mark only rarely, he would recognize what targets I had been ceaselessly aiming at' (MS 175, 64v/OC ยง387). However, as this remark also implies, the responsibility remains with the philosopher-reader to think, and this responsibility is not transferrable. (p. 12)

On Kuusela's reading of the Nachlass and the Investigations, Wittgenstein aimed at the "target" of a "positive contribution to the philosophy of logic" as his goal; on my reading, Wittgenstein's aim was to attack and ultimately undermine that very target. Clearly, this is not the kind of disagreement that can be settled in a review. Whether or not one agrees with him, one can only admire his clear and systematic statement of a positive interpretation of Wittgenstein's method.