Wittgenstein on Rules and Nature

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Keith Dromm, Wittgenstein on Rules and Nature, Continuum, 2008, xxi+124pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826498625.

Reviewed by Lars Hertzberg, Åbo Akademi University



In this book Keith Dromm proposes to resolve a seeming tension in Wittgenstein’s view of philosophy. Wittgenstein claims that the method of philosophy is descriptive, and that philosophers are not in the business of providing explanations — least of all causal explanations - of the phenomena of human life. Yet, in his account of language learning Wittgenstein himself appeals to primitive reactions of the sort he ostensibly rules out. Dromm argues that the tension is only apparent. We should recognize that Wittgenstein’s appeals to primitive reactions are not to be read as causal explanations, but rather as what Dromm (following a suggestion by Robert Nozick) calls philosophical explanations. Such explanations do not aim at increasing our knowledge concerning the phenomena to be explained, but rather at helping us gain a more coherent understanding of them. Philosophical explanations commonly point out ways in which some process might have occurred. Their efficacy does not depend on whether or not they are true, but rather on the ways in which they make us aware of some possibility we tended to overlook, thus forestalling the necessity to look elsewhere. An empirical element enters, we might say, but not as proof.

The book is rich in spite of its brevity, and, for the most part, lucidly argued. The way it brings together some aspects of Wittgenstein’s work is thought-provoking, if not altogether convincing.

Dromm focuses on four contexts in which primitive reactions have a role, two of which are suggested in Philosophical Investigations (§ 244): the learning of psychological avowals: (“the verbal expression of pain replaces crying and does not describe it”), and the uniformity of reactions required in learning to apply concepts (“going on in the same way”).1 Dromm also brings up two nonInvestigations texts: the remarks on Frazer’s Golden Bough where Wittgenstein discusses explanations of primitive ritual, and the notes “Cause and Effects: Intuitive Awareness” where Wittgenstein talks about reacting to the cause as the germ of causal judgment.2 He has little to say about some of the other connections in which Wittgenstein discusses similar phenomena, such as the sections on aspect-seeing and the discussion of aesthetic reactions. According to Dromm, Wittgenstein was, in this connection, influenced by Mauthner, James, Russell and Brouwer, and he points to parallel ideas in Simone Weil.

Dromm points out that a number of philosophers, ignoring Wittgenstein’s methodological remarks, have taken him to have been striving to give a naturalist account of the origins of language (whether in humankind or in the individual). Dromm calls this the standard interpretation, mentioning among its proponents Daniel Hutto, Peter Hacker, Avrum Stroll and Bernard Clack. A special branch of the standard interpretation (on Dromm’s reading), exemplified by Meredith Williams, Colin McGinn, David Pears and Norman Malcolm, takes Wittgenstein’s emphasis on language learning to be intended as a bulwark against skepticism. Among those who reject the standard account he mentions Rush Rhees, Peter Winch (his teacher), Hugh Knott and the present reviewer. (I would have mentioned Frank Cioffi, too, as someone who is close in spirit to Dromm’s reading.)

Against the standard reading, Dromm argues that the explanations advanced by Wittgenstein are not intended as factual hypotheses in the conventional sense. The standard readers ignore the fact that these explanations are, in many cases, explicitly given a tentative formulation (“here is one possibility…”, PI § 244). This gives a hint that they are to be read as philosophical explanations of the sort adumbrated by Nozick: their aim is to help us get a clearer understanding of the phenomena discussed by removing presuppositions that seem to exclude their possibility; or better, perhaps, presuppositions that seem to entail that they could only happen in one way (compare “Somebody must have let the cat out” and “No, it could have got out through here for instance”; here the reply changes the other’s perception of the situation whether or not that was the route actually taken by the cat).

The most thoroughly developed part of the book concerns the authority of first person psychological utterances. As Dromm puts it, the role of Wittgenstein’s suggestion in PI § 244 of a possible way in which verbal expressions of pain may be learnt is to help us recognize, by removing whatever stands in the way of that recognition, that the private sensation is semantically and epistemically irrelevant for the learning process. By suggesting that we look on the verbal avowal of pain as replacing moaning or wincing, Wittgenstein helps us let go of the idea that any cognitive achievement on the part of the learner need be involved, i.e. that of learning to reidentify a sensation.

Of course the replacement account is not the only possibility. There could be other, somewhat bizarre non-cognitive explanations: the learner’s verbal behaviour might happen to undergo the relevant transformation in consequence of her being struck by lightning or taking a pill. Dromm suggests that the advantage of the replacement story is simply that it is more plausible. He seems to be missing a point here. A crucial feature of the replacement story, I would claim, is that it turns our attention from the role of the learner to that of the teacher. Here the focus is less on what happens in the learner and more on other people’s ability to make sense of what she is doing. The natural expression of pain forms part of the background enabling us to understand what the child is trying to say — e.g., that it is indeed pain that she is learning to express. Those other more bizarre hypotheses would leave that matter open. (Dromm does recognize the importance of this dimension in a different context.)

Shifting the focus away from the learning process and onto the teacher’s role has bearing on the replacement story’s scope of application. Dromm claims that an analogous account can be extended to learning to express wishes, intentions and memories. We might have wished for a closer discussion of this claim: it is hard to think, say, of the learning of memory expressions in terms of straightforward replacement. (Something analogous holds for the account, later in the book, of learning to make causal judgments on the basis of natural reactions to causes.) A shift of focus of the kind I am suggesting would have been helpful here. (On the other hand Dromm dismisses Victor Krebs’ suggestion that the pain replacement account has analogies in all language acquisition. Yet focusing on the teachers’ role might have helped him to see what had led Krebs to make his claim; after all, it is because others are able to see the child’s speech as expressive of her life that she can become a participant in the language community. This does not have the character of an empirical hypothesis, however, but is a reflection on what it means to think of someone as a speaker.)

There is a good discussion of the asymmetry between psychological self-ascriptions and third person ascriptions. Dromm is critical of Crispin Wright’s account as well as that of Dorit Bar-On and Douglas C. Long, both of which, he thinks, are based on misleading naturalist presuppositions. He argues that the asymmetry is not as sharp, for Wittgenstein, as many commentators have assumed. In fact third person ascriptions, too, have an expressive dimension. As Dromm puts it: “How we respond to the behaviour and its surroundings is a part of the concept we employ in our third-person ascriptions, and not only the ‘saying and doings’ of the object of our ascriptions” (p. 60). To come to see another as sad, hopeful, etc., is not to conclude that all other interpretations are excluded, but, as a participant in this form of life, to “feel at home” with the ascription.3

This leads to a discussion of rule-following skepticism. Dromm presents a good overview of different answers to skepticism. He argues convincingly that a naturalist response, such as that of Meredith Williams who thinks the thrust of skepticism is to be countered by an appeal to training, is not tenable. (He makes the important observation that whether what someone has undergone is indeed to be called training depends on the end result, so Williams’ argument would be circular.) The source of rule-following skepticism is simply the assumption that there is a gap between the rule and its application, and thus a problem of how the gap is to be filled. The correct response to that is to point out that the relation between the rule and its application is internal; hence, there is no gap.

Wittgenstein’s Frazer remarks are presented by Dromm as a case of using philosophical explanations for a problem that is not itself philosophical. Wittgenstein’s point is that it is misguided to want to explain rituals, say, in genetic terms, since a full description of the ritual will by itself give the satisfaction we seek. Dromm uses the example of Xerxes punishing the Hellespont for smashing the Persians’ bridges. He suggests that Xerxes’ anger can be made intelligible by recognizing our own tendency to act in similar ways. To explain the action by appealing to Xerxes’ beliefs about its effects would simply restate the problem, since the belief and the action are simply two sides of the same coin; hence if the action is unintelligible, so is the belief.

While the details of Dromm’s discussion are often perceptive, I find it hard to get a grip on his overall contention that the notion of philosophical explanations can be used to clarify Wittgenstein’s appeals to natural reactions. He claims that the appeals are too specific to count as the kinds of “bedrock” claims with which everybody would immediately agree; they stand in need of empirical evidence in order to qualify as more than just possibilities. But is this true? Is it just a probable hypothesis in need of confirmation that a child will learn to express pain in the way Wittgenstein describes, or that our learning to count or to name colours is dependent on the fact that most of us tend to go on in roughly the same way? For one thing, these descriptions are so vague that it is hard to tell what would disconfirm them, and for another, it is hard to believe that some wildly different story might be true. It is more plausible to think of their role as that of reminders with which we are expected to agree as soon as we hear them. Furthermore, they are not simply intended to point out possibilities in addition to those to which we were originally drawn; rather Wittgenstein is at the same time trying to make us see that the original accounts are incoherent.

All in all, however, whether or not one agrees with the overall argument, this book is a stimulating read.

1 Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, Basil Blackwell, 1958. (Henceforth PI.)

2 Both reprinted in Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Occasions 1912-1951, ed. by J. C. Klagge and A. Nordmann, Hackett, 1993.

3 Wittgenstein, Zettel, Basil Blackwell, 1967, § 234.