Wittgenstein on Rules: Justification, Grammar, and Agreement

Wittgenstein On Rules

James R. Shaw, Wittgenstein on Rules: Justification, Grammar, and Agreement, Oxford University Press, 2023, 319pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197609989.

Reviewed by Olivia Sultanescu, Concordia University


Many readers of Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations take one of its main ambitions to be that of teaching us how to appreciate the illusory nature of philosophical problems. According to these readers, the rule-following remarks (§§185–242) purport to show that the search for philosophical explanations of meaning is rooted in confusion. James R. Shaw is not among these readers. In his monograph, Wittgenstein on Rules: Justification, Grammar, and Agreement, he convincingly argues that, when viewed in the light of the distinctive methodologies that Wittgenstein pursues, the rule-following remarks emerge as positive contributions to the inquiry into the foundations of meaning. And, according to Shaw, not only does Wittgenstein advance theses in the context of this inquiry, he also provides us with the materials for articulating an answer to Saul Kripke’s meaning sceptic (Kripke 1982).

At the centre of Shaw’s interpretation is the claim that Wittgenstein is engaged in two different projects: a grammatical investigation, and a justificatory investigation. The latter precedes and provides the philosophical motivation for the former, and together, they yield a “thoroughgoing bipartite structure” (1). In the first part of the book, Shaw develops the bipartite reading. In the second part, he investigates the power of this reading to defeat meaning scepticism. The bipartite reading strikes me as both novel and well-motivated. It sheds valuable light not only on Wittgenstein’s views on meaning and rule-following, but also on his views on methods in philosophy. Moreover, Shaw brings Wittgenstein’s remarks to bear on foundational questions about meaning and content in illuminating ways. While it is often true that writing a review of a thought-provoking book leaves one with the feeling of having barely scratched its surface, it is especially true in this case, given the broad ambitions and the philosophical richness of Shaw’s project. After a brief overview, which is bound to be guilty of many omissions, I will examine an aspect of his reading, namely, its construal of the notion of reason. The remainder of my discussion will be devoted to examining Shaw’s intriguing Wittgensteinian solution to Kripke’s problem.

On Shaw’s interpretation, the justificatory project and the grammatical project are governed by distinct questions and underpinned by distinct methodologies. The justificatory project starts with the scenario of the so-called Wayward Child described at §185 and investigates, by deploying a trial-and-error methodology, whether we are justified in applying rules in the ways in which we do. The Wayward Child seems to have mastered the series of natural numbers—for he is able to continue the series 1, 2, 3, . . . correctly—but when we try to teach him how to add two, though he writes the series correctly until 1000, he continues from there with 1004, 1008, 1012, while insisting, to our puzzlement, that he is going on in the same way as before. Many commentators think that this scenario purports to bring into view the question of what makes ‘1002, 1004, 1006, 1008, . . .’ the correct continuation of the series corresponding to the order to add two, and to reveal the significance of our shared natural inclinations for a proper treatment of that question. But Shaw thinks that what is at issue is not the constitution of the correct continuation of the series, but our justification for taking that continuation to be correct. On Shaw’s reading, Wittgenstein seeks to uncover a philosophical temptation that the ordinary use of words inclines us to feel, namely, the temptation to think that there must be mental accompaniments to our uses of expressions that “anticipate future applications [. . .] in a way that is immune to misinterpretation” (23) and can in this way address “extraordinary doubts” (43) of the sort raised by the Wayward Child. This thought is misguided, however, for any consideration we might draw on when dealing with the Wayward Child is bound to be misinterpreted and thus to be ineffective in correcting him. The conclusion, according to Shaw, is that “anything that counts as rule-following must proceed without appeal to reasons or justifications at some points” (239).

The grammatical investigation, which begins around §197, and consists in “focused discussion of a new set of topics: practices, customs, training, regularity, familiar human behavior and activities, and human agreement” (64), aims to reveal that the picture of meaning undermined by the justificatory investigation seems mandatory only if we do not attend to the use of expressions such as ‘meaning’ or ‘rule-following’ and to the “factors [that] influence when we are, and are not, inclined to say that rules are being followed or not” (71). This inquiry belongs to metasemantics, with the caveat that the metasemantical project is pursued by Wittgenstein in a distinctive way, for he takes concepts like meaning and rule-following to be family-resemblance concepts, and thus to be elucidated by situating “talk of meaning within a network of uses that together illuminate its role in language” (71) as opposed to searching for necessary and sufficient conditions for their application. In order to illuminate the way in which Wittgenstein situates our talk of meaning, Shaw fleshes out in detail his skeletal remarks for various thought experiments. What emerges is an interpretation according to which “meaning-free characterizations of what meaning something by one’s words consists in” are viable (101, footnote 18). In this respect, Shaw’s reading is sharply different from that of interpreters like John McDowell and Barry Stroud. It is also different from attempts, such as Paul Horwich’s, to attribute to Wittgenstein a dispositionalist view of meaning. For Shaw, a general account of meaning-constituting facts is not in the offing, though various features, such as regularity and agreement, are nevertheless revealed to be playing a constitutive role in our deeming words meaningful.

Many commentators have appealed to Wittgenstein’s remarks on agreement to motivate attributing revisionist views to him, such as forms of conventionalism or communitarianism, which place agreement at the forefront. The usefulness of the distinction between the two projects is especially clear in relation to these remarks, which, Shaw persuasively argues in Chapter 5, appear both in the context of the justificatory project and in the context of the grammatical one, and employ different notions of agreement. Wittgenstein touches on what Shaw calls “concordant agreement”, which amounts to the accord between a rule and its application, and “concurring agreement”, which amounts to shared belief between individuals (106). As Shaw sees it, Wittgenstein focuses on concurring agreement in the sections that conclude the rule-following block (§§240–242) not because of its special constitutive role, but because the idea that it can play a constitutive role might seem to raise special problems. Understanding the way in which Wittgenstein deals with these problems requires attending to the way in which he takes himself to be entitled to blur the boundary between semantics and metasemantics.

As Shaw acknowledges, the literature devoted to Wittgenstein abounds with reconstructions of his charges against conceptions of meaningfulness as a psychological process that accompanies an expression; there is no doubt that Wittgenstein is very critical of this attempt.[1] The question is whether these charges belong to a distinct foundational inquiry concerning the justification for our uses of words that precedes and motivates the grammatical investigation, in the manner suggested by Shaw. Shaw draws on a host of considerations for making his case here, including the puzzling fact that Wittgenstein barely touches on dispositions—and when he does, he dismisses them on epistemic grounds, a fact that is perfectly intelligible if the question pursued is justificatory as opposed to constitutive. Nevertheless, a worry might be raised about how Shaw draws on the notion of reason in articulating the justificatory project. For Shaw, “giving a reason often involves showing elements in a process (like that of copying) that terminates in the action” (16). This is how he takes Wittgenstein’s own earlier definition, according to which “giving a reason for something one did or said means showing a way which leads to this action."[2] But on the face of it, this explanation of the notion of reason is ambiguous. It might be understood as a way that supports or recommends the action, but it might also be understood as a way that is guaranteed to result in the action. The first understanding foregrounds the normative dimension of reasons; the second one obscures it. Shaw seems to operate with the second. This is suggested by the way in which the question that underpins the justificatory project is framed, namely, as the question of “what justification (or, equivalently, what reason), broadly on the model of ordinary justifications [. . .] we have for following a rule in the way we do, such that even if a bizarre misinterpreter were to possess that justification, they would apply the rule as we would to new cases” (23, italics added).

It is not easy to see why the question deserves its label, for what we are allegedly seeking is something that would succeed in drawing out the correct response from the Wayward Child. Thus, what is at issue, on Shaw’s reading, is what he would in fact do, as opposed to what he ought to do. However, it is an essential characteristic of reasons and justifications more generally that we might fail to respond to them; they would lack normative significance in the absence of this possibility. The discovery that someone is not moved by the considerations we offer to her as reasons cannot reveal, then, a deficiency in their operating as reasons. Thus, if the scenario aims to show merely that we lack justification in basic cases, it is not clear to me that it can succeed. Nevertheless, this worry concerns the proper conception of the upshot of the justificatory investigation, and not Shaw’s overall careful and convincing case in favour of the bipartite reading.

How might Wittgenstein respond to Kripke’s sceptic? Shaw takes the sceptic to be “engaged exclusively in the constitutive project largely free of substantive epistemic and normative constraints” (180). He thinks he is entitled to this reading, despite Kripke’s numerous remarks concerning justification, given that those remarks can be viewed as the result the attempt to “shoehorn Wittgenstein’s distinct justificatory project [. . .] and grammatical project [. . .] into a single problem” (186). Wittgenstein’s idea that the presence of regularity is required if we are to be willing to say that a rule is being followed can be deployed, Shaw thinks, toward the articulation of what, echoing David Lewis, he calls a “naïve reply” (218–219) to the sceptical challenge. What makes 1002, 1004, and so on, the correct continuation of the series ‘0, 2, 4, . . .,1000’? According to Shaw, it is the fact that this continuation is the most regular one. Similarly, we mean addition, and not quaddition, because “addition is the most regular and uniform continuation of the clearly good applications we make” (219). Importantly, the notions of uniformity on which the reply draws are “ordinary, intuitive concepts”, such that “even a grade schooler can understand [them]” (223). They are immune not only to the results of scientific inquiry, but also—and here is where Shaw’s Wittgensteinian solution is most obviously different from Lewis’s—to metaphysical investigations into the nature of properties. Thus, on Shaw’s reading, by exploiting the foundations of our practices of meaning attribution, Wittgenstein can secure the naïveté that Lewis was seeking without incurring heavy metaphysical costs. Could this provide us with a satisfactory answer to the sceptic?

Shaw claims that Kripke has not considered this intriguing response, and I am inclined to agree. But the intuitive notion of regularity will not survive the sceptic’s scrutiny if it turns out to be question-begging. Shaw argues that it is not, because the facts about regularity on which he draws are not semantic facts; they are “not facts about meanings or intentions at all, let alone past ones.” He motivates this by noting that “there would be more or less regular continuations of various patterns (e.g., in the tides, or seasonal weather, etc.) even if there were no human beings in existence, and nothing ever meant anything—no words or thoughts of any kind” (225).

It is certainly true that, strictly speaking, the concept of regularity does not state semantic facts. But if the application of this concept to segments of uses of expressions is to bear the fruit that Shaw needs, it must presuppose that the relevant uses are imbued with some significance. Shaw seems to grant this very point in some of his characterizations of the relevant segments: he says of the naïve reply that it “applies notions of uniformity to an “initial segment” of a function” (223, italics added) and of addition that it is “the total function that most regularly extends the partial function picked out by past privileged use of “+”” (230, italics added). But if we must regard existing uses as picking out something in order to be able to discern the patterns that enable us to formulate a criterion for correct continuations, it seems to me that we are vulnerable to the very charge that Shaw intends to avoid, namely, that of begging the question against the sceptic. This remains true even if we grant Shaw that those uses might be singled out entirely by “leaning on our ordinary appreciation of human responses of approval and disapproval, expectation and frustration, and so on” (218).

Another way to see why the sceptic might reasonably object to the appeal to regularity is by considering Shaw’s claim that “the regularity in question is one that distinguishes among something closer to mathematical objects—and as such is a regularity that would exist even if there was no usage” (220). But what is at issue in the context of meaning scepticism is how usage latches on to mathematical objects in the first place. The claim that some attachments yield more regularity than others is arguably just as problematic as the claim, which Kripke does consider, that some hypotheses about what expressions mean are simpler than others. In Kripke’s words, “if we do not understand what two hypotheses state, what does it mean to say that one is ‘more probable’ because it is ‘simpler’?” (1982, 38). Similarly, we might ask, if we do not understand how a linguistic expression picks out a function—indeed, any function, or segment thereof—what does it mean to say that, given an initial segment of uses, one is a better candidate than another because the corresponding continuation is more regular?[3]

As before, I do not take this worry to pose a threat to Shaw’s view, but only to recommend a non-reductive construal of the regularity elucidated through the grammatical investigation. After all, the non-reductionist, who resists the possibility of meaning-free characterisations of the constituents of meaning, should aspire to explain why we mean addition and not quaddition, though whatever account she offers is bound to take the idea of meaning for granted. On the face of it, the claim that addition provides the most regular continuation is a promising way of developing such an account. What is more, it seems to me that this is the kind of illumination of meaning that Wittgenstein himself is after: one that is pursued from a position that takes the idea of understanding expressions in certain ways for granted, and which is thus more plausibly viewed as rejecting some of the presuppositions that lead to the sceptic’s demand than as yielding an answer to that demand. But whether or not Shaw is persuaded to take the non-reductionist path in his reading of Wittgenstein, the answer to Kripke’s challenge that he provides by drawing on Wittgensteinian materials deserves to be carefully considered by anyone interested in understanding either Wittgenstein or Kripke, indeed by anyone interested in foundational questions about language and mind. Overall, his monograph offers both a fascinating reading of Wittgenstein and a compelling demonstration of his relevance for contemporary philosophy.

ACKNOWLEDGMENTS: I am grateful to Claudine Verheggen, Samuel Steadman, Ulf Hlobil, and Alex Miller for helpful comments.


Saul Kripke, Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language: An Elementary Exposition, Oxford: Blackwell, (1982).

Ludwig Wittgenstein, The Blue and Brown Books, Second edition, Harper & Row, (1958).

[1] Shaw argues that some of Wittgenstein’s interpreters fail to properly internalize these charges. Hannah Ginsborg is one such interpreter, according to him, for on her view “meanings are secured in significant part by conscious mental accompaniments”—after all, “it seems important to Ginsborg that the attitude [of primitive normativity] be conscious” (57). But it seems to me that this reading of Ginsborg is not entirely right. Her talk of consciousness is meant to capture the way in which the mind makes contact with the normative domain, which is why she conceives of it as consciousness of appropriateness. Indeed, she is adamant that this consciousness is manifested as a distinctive kind of intentional attitude, individuated by the presence of appropriateness in its content. This is at odds with viewing it as an occurrent conscious episode that must be present whenever a rule is followed.

[2] He continues: “In some cases it means telling the way which one has gone oneself; in others it means describing a way which leads there and is in accordance with certain accepted rules.” (1958, 14).

[3] Shaw addresses Kripke’s dismissal of the appeal to simplicity, but he takes Kripke to have in mind “appeals to simplicity in the natural sciences” (221), and thus not to be targeting the ordinary notion of regularity with which Shaw operates. But while Kripke introduces the appeal to simplicity as a move likely to be made by someone “under the influence of too much philosophy of science” (38), his dismissal is articulated in general terms, and it exploits the fact that the choice between meanings is, regardless of domain, downstream from the intelligibility of the notion of meaning.