Wittgenstein on Sensation and Perception

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Michael Hymers, Wittgenstein on Sensation and Perception, Routledge, 2017, 202pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781844658565.

Reviewed by Sonia Sedivy, University of Toronto Scarborough


Just what does Wittgenstein's later work suggest about sensation and perception? Given the renewed interest in perception and sensation over the past three decades, these are important questions to pursue. In this book, Michael Hymers highlights the diverse ways in which the mistaken picture of a private phenomenal space figures in arguments for sense-data and qualia. Hymers brings together a wide range of passages from Wittgenstein's later writings to show how they criticize this picture. This is a fascinating and hard-hitting selection. Yet it is connected to a limiting construal of Wittgenstein's method that informs Hymers' interpretive approach. Hymers emphasizes that Wittgenstein's approach is grammatical in teaching us to identify misleading analogies or metaphors. Moreover, the analogy between physical space and phenomenal space is the 'paradigm' of a misleading analogy from whose identification Wittgenstein develops his method more generally. These points support Hymers' genetic or genealogical interpretive approach: the genesis of Wittgenstein's method in his critique of misleading analogies between phenomenal and physical space continues to inform his use of the grammatical method substantively throughout his work all the way to the Philosophical Investigations, and suggests that we look for the provenance of later ideas in earlier ones.

The first half of the book uses this interpretive focus to reconstruct a range of Wittgenstein's views: regarding sense data and spectrum inversion, the private language argument and aspect perception, and first-person avowals of pains or sensations more generally. The second half shows how the approach can be used to adjudicate recent debates over first person authority, and to criticize recent positions that defend sense-data and qualia -- including arguments for spectrum inversion, zombies and even Nagel's view that "there is something it is like" to be a sentient animal with a perspective.

Hymers argues that Wittgenstein was never committed to sense data. What Wittgenstein briefly affirmed was the idea that we might talk of sense-data without ontological commitment -- to describe how objects appear without any suggestion that there are sense-data as well as physical objects. But he swiftly comes to reject such talk since it invites confusion between 'the grammar of a statement about sense data and the grammar of an outwardly similar statement about physical objects.' (Wittgenstein 1958, 70; in Hymers 54) Hymers emphasizes that the issues center around space. Though we could introduce new conventions for speaking of appearances as sense-data, talking in this way cannot avoid carrying over the grammar of spatial objects to phenomenal counterparts -- such as faulty analogues of the spatial relationship between a perceiver and an object and its properties. Since disanalogies inevitably fall from view, confusion seems inescapable if we objectify appearances through the analogical notion of a phenomenal space.

Hymers' aim in tracing Wittgenstein's critique of sense-data is more far-reaching. His point is to show how this critique was 'entwined' with Wittgenstein's development of his grammatical method, which yields 'surveyable representations' of our grammar, of the 'possibilities of expression offered up by our linguistic conventions.' (53) This 'entwining' is the basis for the genetic or genealogical approach that Hymers proposes. Specific interpretations are supported by establishing the longevity and provenance of certain ideas, going back from the Philosophical Investigations to textually similar passages in earlier texts.

For example, harking back to earlier lecture notes and the Big Typescript, Hymers argues that the private language passages [§§243-275, through 315] especially sections 257 and 258, turn on the mistaken analogy between pointing to and naming objects in physical space and focusing on and naming sensations, understood as objects in phenomenal space. His reading invokes the backdrop of the first 64 sections of the Philosophical Investigations, highlighting how a public context is necessary for teaching words to name objects and their properties -- to disambiguate what is being pointed out, for example. We might be tempted to imagine that it is possible to take away such background conditions for teaching the use of words when it comes to one's own sensations, just as section 257 considers, because insofar as sensations are like objects in phenomenal space it seems we could be aware of such objects without ambiguity. But section 258 shows that there is no determinacy in the phenomenal case: the apparent determinacy comes from the analogy to ordinary objects and properties whereas section 257 has taken away the resources for disambiguation that ordinary life practices afford.

This is a straightforward and streamlined account of the private language passages. For better and for worse, exclusive focus on the ways in which the analogy between phenomenal and physical space informs these passages cuts Hymers' interpretation off from others. The pay-off is that it avoids some deflationary interpretive tangents, such as disputes over the role played by memory and the possibility of Robinson Crusoes. Yet it is also disconnected from a range of significant interpretive concerns, such as those raised by John Canfield (2001) or John McDowell (1998) to name only two. This cost derives from an exclusivity of focus that is questionable, to which I will return.

The second main exegetical contribution concerns first person avowals. Drawing extensively on a range of texts, Hymers reconstructs Wittgenstein's work as arguing against an evidential or epistemic understanding of first person authority. The authority of a claim such as 'I am in pain' is cast in epistemic terms because the misleading analogy between phenomenal and physical space suggests an evidential picture where one stands in a relation to her own states as evidence to which only the subject has access. Moreover, Hymers argues that first person authority is not based on the satisfaction of criteria. The notion of criterial connections is controversial. Two chief proposals are that criteria connect sensations with worldly circumstances either (i) as necessary -- not empirical -- "evidence" that is defeasible; or (ii) through definition. Instead, Hymers emphasizes the expressive nature of first-person authority, which arises from the fact that one's ability to make a claim such as 'I am in pain' results from having learned to express pain using language. This turns on Wittgenstein's view that when children learn to say that they are in pain they are learning to replace the natural expression of crying with a linguistic expression. This does not suggest that saying that I am in pain is only a replacement of crying, but that the development of this region of meaningful language depends on connections between pain and associated activities, and retains an expressive use among others. Hymers extends this approach to perceptions with the suggestion that we learn to replace natural expressions of perceptions, such as pointing, with linguistic expressions. This is interesting because it connects our perceptions with our activities in the world even while preserving their distinctive first-person authority. Though, as Hymers notes, it does not go so far as to explain what we see, the objects of perception.

This exegetical approach is applied to recent debate over first person authority, fairly recent defenses of sense-data (by Jackson 1977 and Robinson 1994), and theories of qualia or qualitative dimensions of experience which, it is argued, cannot be described or conveyed linguistically and which allow for complete colour spectrum inversion (by authors such as Jackson 1982; Shoemaker 1975, 1982, 1990; and Block 1996, 2007).

Hymers' arguments against sense-datum and qualia theories turn jointly on ferreting out misleading analogies between physical and phenomenal space, and defending Wittgenstein's view that there are internal connections between our activities, including various uses of language, expressive ones among them, and our first-person perspectives. Hymers argues against a common line of defense from Wittgensteinian objections. Such defenses charge that insisting on connections between what we can say, do, perceive and feel is mistaken behaviourism or verificationism. Hymers counters that it is the assumption that sensations are like objects in phenomenal space that makes it seem that denying sense-data yields a behaviorist denial of mental states tout court. Similarly, Wittgenstein's reasons for denying that it makes sense to suppose complete spectrum inversion do not trade on verificationism. The possibility of undetectable disagreement in our use of colour terms severs the connection between our use of colour words and colour samples, and 'such undetectable disagreement appears intelligible only if we already assume that the meanings of colour-terms are determined by their alleged application in private, phenomenal space.' (169)

These are just a sample of the ways in which Hymers argues against the range of arguments in favour of sense-data or qualia. Though specific arguments are more detailed and complex, my aim has been to bring out the argumentative strategy since the detail cannot be dealt with in a short review. And it is the strategy or methodology that is a concern. The question is whether a historically linear model makes sense, one where ideas in later works are interpreted and supported in terms of earlier versions of apparently same or similar ideas.

In an opposing approach, Joachim Schulte (2013) argues that it is questionable whether we can think of Wittgenstein's various notebooks and lecture notes as 'works' that are then subject to revision, and that verbal similarity between a notebook entry and a passage in the Investigations need not suggest that they say the same things since Wittgenstein 'mined' his earlier notebooks for ways in which he could convey evolving, possibly quite different views. For example, textual similarities between passages in the Big Typescript and the Philosophical Investigations -- which is the only later text written for publication by Wittgenstein -- do not straightforwardly suggest continuity of thought or method. Even if readers might not agree with the high degree of textual sensitivity Schulte advocates, it is necessary to be self-conscious about the problems he raises. Hymers' exegetical practice and argumentative strategies do not consider such issues. I would like to highlight that Hymers' method extracts passages in the Philosophical Investigations to consider their historical development without considering their place within the complex tapestry of considerations that the Investigations weave together. This leaves unexamined how interconnections among passages in this one work may shape their import.

We have seen that his reading of Wittgenstein's discussion of private language disconnects these passages from their context in the Philosophical Investigations by emphasizing only the mistaken analogy between physical and phenomenal space and drawing on earlier texts for support through textually similar passages. But the private language passages -- whatever their genealogy -- are placed by Wittgenstein in the Philosophical Investigations after the considerations of following rules [§138-242]. Hymers' interpretation does not consider these discussions, making connections only with the opening sections about teaching the use of names.

One problem is that this does not problematize how we might go astray in understanding our ability to pick out physical objects and their properties -- in thought, talk or perception -- beyond the point early in the Investigations that ostension of objects in public space requires much background understanding. (As for example, Wittgenstein suggests in §31 that to point out the king in chess to someone, that person must already know about games, board games, pieces, etc.) This is a serious oversight. If we are tempted by a flawed picture of how we refer to physical objects, and (as John McDowell (1998) has argued) we carry this over by analogy to our self-awareness, then the problem with the analogical extension isn't just that sensations are not private objects or that we do not stand to our own states as observers do to objects. The problem is also that our self-awareness might carry over mistaken features from our picture of reference to physical objects.

For a better understanding of how the 'object and designation' model does and does not fit our sensations, we need to focus not just on objects but on designation. This is where the rule following passages may help. Concepts are rules. Examining how we follow rules offers a way to examine conceptual abilities. In more standard phrasing, examining how we follow rules helps examine how we "apply" concepts in thought or talk or perception or action -- how we designate an object, for example.

What if I see an apple and say 'pass the red apple please'? We might suppose that the ability to follow a rule consists in applying an interpretation of a rule in thought. But Wittgenstein shows that the interpretive model is mistaken; it renders rule following indeterminate since there is always an alternative interpretation of a rule that could fit with whatever one goes on to do. The idea that we apply an interpretation of a rule in thought also commits us to supposing that we grasp an object in a way that is free of the rule so that an interpretation of the rule is applied. If reference to objects in space works in this way, it would involve a mental grasp of the object or a representational content of the object in which rules or concepts do not apply. But Wittgenstein's interweaving considerations about the non-interpretive immediacy of skilled rule following also warn us away from this feature of the interpretive model of following rules. This is a subtle way that the rule following considerations are important for exploring our ability to refer to physical spatial objects. It broadens our outlook on the private language passages. If we suppose that we "apply" interpretations of rules, we suppose that we have a mental grasp of our own states, uninterpreted, and then we try to refer to them, to keep track of them, to apply one's own rule to them.

I am not suggesting that this is all that the rule-following and private language passages do -- they connect with other considerations to bear on a host of interrelated issues. But they work together in this one way among others. Chasing out the presupposition that our ability to designate objects involves a mental grasp of the object to which an interpretation of a rule is applied helps us recognize a version of this flawed picture when it comes to our own states. There is no "uninterpreted object" in the mental or specifically sensory case, or alternatively, there is no "uninterpreted state" of oneself to which a rule is applied. Rather, just as our skillful interaction with others in the world involves various uses of language that make reference to spatial objects, it can involve uses of language that make reference to states of ourselves. None of these -- outer or "inner" -- are present to us "uninterpreted" to which interpretations of rules are applied.

This more inclusive exegetical approach allows a more complex picture to emerge that makes more connections not only within Wittgenstein's work, but also with seemingly everlasting tendencies in philosophical thought. We see the relevance of Wittgenstein's work not only to positing sense-data or qualia. We also see the relevance to the more recent trend to posit nonconceptual contents -- which is the idea that conceptual abilities involve something uninterpreted, a nonconceptual mental grasp of something to which an interpretation of a rule or concept applies. I am not suggesting that we read Wittgenstein's work with the aim that it apply to all our concerns. But it makes sense that Wittgenstein's work would have some lessons for content approaches to perception as well as to the recent revolt from this framework with purely relational theories.


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