Wittgenstein: Opening Investigations

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Michael Luntley, Wittgenstein: Opening Investigations, Wiley Blackwell, 2015, 179pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781118978498.

Reviewed by Lars Hertzberg, Åbo Akademi University


Michael Luntley advances an original reading of the early parts of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations. He partners, as it were, with Wittgenstein, proposing a way of formulating Wittgenstein's thoughts which the latter, for some reason, was unable or unwilling to provide -- a genre pioneered by Jaakko Hintikka. Luntley wishes to reframe our way of reading Wittgenstein by asking what theories he is trying to launch. The boldness of his project is refreshing. However, in my view, more is lost than is gained in the attempt. In the end, Wittgenstein comes across as a run-of-the-mill analytic philosopher. This may have been Luntley's intention.

Luntley questions the widely shared notion that one of the things Wittgenstein takes Augustine to task for in the opening remarks of Philosophical Investigations is invoking ostensive definitions in his account of language learning. According to Luntley, Wittgenstein does not explicitly argue against ostensive definition as a fundamental method of assigning meaning, rather he simply takes it for granted that ostensive definitions can only be used in a context that is already grammatically constituted. This observation on Luntley's part may be new and valid, but it does not make a huge difference to the overall understanding of Wittgenstein's view of language learning (consider, for instance, Wittgenstein's remarks about private ostensive definition in § 258).

In fact, Luntley claims, if Wittgenstein is critical of Augustine at the start of Philosophical Investigations, it is because he is proposing an essentialist account of language, according to which language is simply made up of names of objects. The builders' game in §2, we read, is not to be understood as a reductio of Augustine's account of language learning; rather, it is meant to show how limited a language would have to be in order to fit Augustine's story. This, I would argue, is in line with the received understanding of Wittgenstein's discussion of the builders' game.

Luntley correctly notes that Wittgenstein distinguishes between ostensive definition and ostensive teaching, the latter being a process in which pointing plays a part, rather than being a fundamental method of assigning meaning. Through it, the learner is drawn into the shared activity which constitutes the language-game. What word meanings can be conveyed is dependent on the learner's capacity for joint attention: his or her ability to select the relevant object as the target for attention. Such abilities must be given before language. According to Luntley this means that Wittgenstein has a "mentalist" theory of language learning. He admits this claim "will be anathema to many Wittgenstein scholars", adding the comment -- witty if incongruous -- that he suspects that Wittgenstein is right here; "to be right", of course, is to be in agreement with Luntley (p. 54).

Ostensive teaching is central to Luntley's reading of Wittgenstein. It plays a role in his argument that Wittgenstein did not really hold that grammar is autonomous, as is frequently thought, in the sense that it can neither be justified nor explained by an appeal to how things are in the world.

Luntley's argument that grammar can be justified is complex and somewhat evasive. He suggests that someone who argues that grammar can be justified by an appeal to how things are need not mean how things are "in the raw" -- i.e. independently of grammatical constitution -- as the coarser forms of realism (what Luntley calls "bold realism") would have it. In place of this he (and Wittgenstein, as read by Luntley) proposes what he calls a "modest realism". He writes

the core realist idea that it is the world as such that justifies grammar need not require that the world as such is the same as the world in the raw. The notion of the world as such is just the notion of the things and properties of the world being a certain way and their being that way constraining our use of words to speak of these things . . . What, if anything, would rule that option out as incoherent? (p. 113)

Just what does Luntley mean here? On one, rather simplistic reading, he is proposing that someone who has learned to use words which refer to physical properties has thereby acquired the ability to perceive whether the words apply to objects of a certain kind (thus, someone who knows what colour is can decide by looking that a book is the sort of thing that may be a certain colour) -- this, then, is taken to justify the grammar of these words. However, it is hard to see how this account can avoid being circular. (Judging something to be red is not simply responding to a visual impression: consider e.g. the way colour is assigned to objects of different kinds or under varying light conditions; reflecting on this should make it obvious that the ability to assign colour requires immersion in a culture.) A more interesting suggestion might be this: there is a grammatical difference between words that can be conveyed through ostensive teaching and words that cannot -- thus (this is my example), the fact that Hamlet is a fictitious character and Julius Caesar a real person is not an empirical matter but something that will show up as a difference in the grammar of the two names. The grammar of the name "Julius Caesar" being what it is is dependent on -- as it were justified by -- Julius Caesar's having at one time been there to be pointed out.

The latter idea, I believe, is worth reflecting on. But in any case, it only applies to a very limited area of language. Perhaps other readings could be imagined. I cannot guess from Luntley's words what they might be.

Luntley furthermore argues that grammar can be explained by appealing to the way human beings are constituted, since it is dependent on pre-linguistic capacities for joint attention. I wonder if anyone arguing for the autonomy of grammar has ever wanted to deny this. Besides, it is not new; his discussion brings to mind the debate about primitive reactions -- not mentioned by Luntley -- among Wittgenstein's readers.[1] Part of Luntley's story about ostensive teaching is that the learner acquires a sense of fit between a word and what it refers to. This point he elaborates by saying that the account of language learning is ultimately an aesthetic story. But what role might the sense of fit have? What reason do we have to suppose that the language learner actually experiences such a sense, rather than simply comes to attend to objects in an apposite way? How can we tell whether or not such a feeling is present? (Besides, learners presumably often catch on to the meanings of names of objects in passing rather than through an express act of ostensive teaching, but this is a minor point.)

On this basis Luntley suggests that Wittgenstein can be read as proposing an explanatory, "mentalist" theory of language learning. Yet he makes clear that what he has in mind is not an empirical hypothesis, but rather a summing up of platitudinous reminders aimed at helping us get a clear view of the phenomena -- "eine übersichtliche Darstellung". Whether this should be called a theory is I guess a matter of one's taste in words.

Luntley argues that an assembly of reminders may yield a surprising result which can be articulated in the form of a proposition. On this point he claims a disagreement with the therapeutic reading of Wittgenstein -- one of his bêtes noirs (the other one is the reading of Gordon Baker and Peter Hacker) -- which, he thinks, holds that the outcome of such an assembly must itself be platitudinous.

Along the way, Luntley makes some obscure moves. In his use of the expression "assigning meaning", especially in the introductory part of the book, he seems to waver between the notion of conveying meaning to a language learner, and giving a new meaning to a term (see p. 38 f), though later on (p. 46) he berates Baker and Hacker for running the two notions together.

I found it hard to follow Luntley's discussion of the normativity of meaning. He argues that grammar for Wittgenstein is a descriptive rather than normative notion. If by this he means, as he seems to do, that grammar is not to be understood as a means for determining in advance which uses of words do or do not make sense, I agree with him. However in one place (p. 140 f), he argues that meaning is not a normative notion on the grounds that -- meaning being regarded as a matter of truth-conditions -- there is no general obligation to speak the truth. He seems to mean that we are under no obligation to make an assertion just because it is true, yet it would be more natural to express the link between truth and obligation by saying that we are (in normal circumstances) under an obligation not to make an assertion if it is false.

Luntley defines normativity as concerned with actions, with what we should do or ought to do. A little later (p. 142) he suggests that belief is a normative notion in the sense that we are not permitted to believe something false. This sounds like an odd claim to make; apart from anything else, taking Luntley at his word would entail that believing something is an action.

This is a short book, but it might well have been shorter. The line of thought is cluttered up rather than clarified by a panoply of terms and distinctions ("the Augustinian picture" vs. "the Augustinian conception", referentialism vs. the determination thesis, etc.). The line of argument makes frequent detours, and some passages are highly repetitive. On the whole, the book seems to have been produced in a hurry: in the list of references two items by Baker are mentioned, differing only slightly in their title and year of publication, M. Engelmann is referred to now as Englemann, and later as Engelmman, the name of the current (November 2016) president of the U.S. is repeatedly misspelt. A stylistic curiosity is Luntley's use of the word "outwith" in the sense of "outside" or "beyond". In these pages I came across it more frequently than during my entire previous life.

Although I am rather critical of Luntley's argument, I do not think this is a book to be shunned. Especially those who find Luntley's reading uncongenial would profit from reading him because of the way he forces one to reflect on the relation between Wittgenstein's work and its relation to philosophical theory-building.

[1] See above all Hugh Knott, "Before Language and After", Philosophical Investigations 21 (1998), 44-54; Rush Rhees, "Language as Emerging from Instinctive Behaviour", Philosophical Investigations 20 (1997), 1-14; Peter Winch, Critical Notice of Malcolm, Wittgensteinian Themes, Philosophical Investigations 20 (1997), 51-64. I've also touched on the topic in "Very General Facts of Nature", in Oskari Kuusela & Marie McGinn (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Wittgenstein. Oxford University Press, 2011.