Wittgenstein Reads Weininger

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Stern, David and Szabados, Béla, (eds.), Wittgenstein Reads Weininger, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 206pp, $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521532604.

Reviewed by John Holbo, National University of Singapore


Béla Szabados' contribution to the Szabados-Stern co-edited Wittgenstein Reads Weininger volume is "Eggshells or Nourishing Yolk?" The title nods to a remark by Wittgenstein. "What is inherited from others can be nothing but egg shells. We should treat the fact of their presence with indulgence, but they will not give us spiritual nourishment" (CV, 27). Szabados seek to defeat such deflationism by reading 'nourishing' significance into Weininger's influence on Wittgenstein. No contributor takes the eggshell line (although Joachim Schulte touches it). So Szabados' question becomes the reviewer's, concerning this volume. Got yolk?

First, a step back. Otto Weininger was a Viennese author, cult figure, tormented soul, who committed suicide in 1903, at the age of 23, in the house were Beethoven once lived. He wrote two books, Sex and Character and On Last Things; the former, our editors explain, "is a little like a highbrow version of Men are from Mars, Women are from Venus for turn of the century Vienna, with a good deal of racism, homophobia and sexism thrown in" (p. 8). Yet Weininger's genius (or talent, or cultural impact) was acknowledged by "Ford Madox Ford, James Joyce, Franz Kafka, Karl Kraus, Charlotte Perkins-Gilman, Gertrude Stein, and August Strindberg." These are just the literary acknowledgements (and they leave out William Carlos Williams). Hitler praised Weininger (for his suicide). Weininger impressed -- perhaps influenced -- Freud. He influenced Wittgenstein, who writes:

I think there is some truth in my idea that I am really only reproductive in my thinking. I think I have never invented a line of thinking but that it was always provided for me by someone else & I have done no more than passionately take it up for my work of clarification. That is how Boltzmann Hertz Schopenhauer Frege, Russell, Kraus, Loos Weininger Spengler, Sraffa have influenced me. (CV, 16)

Add a few hints, e.g. that the category of 'reproductive' (vs. original) thinkers was important for Weininger; add biographical evidence that Wittgenstein took Weininger seriously from youth until his death. One has the outlines of an interesting puzzle.

Szabados says there is enough 'direct evidence' – five pieces, to be exact – on which to work (p. 33). First, a letter in which, responding to G.E. Moore's dismissal of Sex and Character as "fantastic", Wittgenstein describes it as 'great and fantastic'. "It is his enormous mistake which is great, I.e. roughly speaking if you add a "∼" to the whole book it says an important truth." Second, a recollected conversation (with Drury) in which Weininger is praised as "a great genius" but "full and prejudices" and wrong about women (being the source of evil).[1] Third, a journal entry in which Weininger's view of 'character' (as unalterable) is qualified or denied (CV, 95). Fourth, a passage from Philosophical Grammar in which Wittgenstein says he is tempted to regard faces themselves as cowardly or kind (i.e. not as mere symptom or signs of 'inner' qualities.) The passage contains a parenthetical "compare e.g. Weininger" (PG, 176-7). Finally, a passage in which Spengler is said to be right "not to classify Weininger with the western philosophers" (CV, 23).

Szabados is not after "one big answer" but is looking for "multiple and interrelated lines of influence." His 'working hypothesis' is that "upon his return to philosophy in 1929, Wittgenstein reread Weininger's works again and again." The evidence? Wittgenstein's preoccupation with "themes" which preoccupied Weininger --e.g. genius, originality, creativity, culture, influence.

This evidence is thin. This is not a problem for Szabados only. It is necessarily a problem for every contributor to a volume entitled Wittgenstein Reads Weininger. I am sure every contributor is aware of this, but the point needs explicit development. The best direct evidence -- the '' Wittgenstein would add to Sex and Character -- is bound to be a veritable weathervane in cross-breezes of 'themes', which for their part might reasonably be taken to establish only Wittgenstein's affinity with post-romantic German intellectual culture in some broad sense. Szabados goes on to list, additionally: interest in clarification; reverence for ordinary language; use of the metaphor of 'lenses' between subject and world (whose features are mistaken for features of the world). But that last item is a stock prop of every lecture on Kantian epistemology; the value of plain speech has been preached by many; clarification has been praised, in some sense, by most major philosophers. Szabados of course tries to make out that the thematic alignments are strikingly specific. His exercises in comparative thematics do not deserve flat dismissal. Let me simply say I would have liked more explicit acknowledgment that noteworthy similarities are one thing; proofs of influence quite another.

Furthermore, the more specific the thematic fit, the more often we back into another problem: many Weiningerian themes are Schopenhauerian -- e.g. genius, solipsism, microcosm/macrocosm; concern with transcendental 'limits'; belief in immutable, ideal Character; also, interest in faces ('Physiognomie'). Schopenhauer influenced Weininger. He also influenced Wittgenstein. This confluence of influence is acknowledged by Allan Janik (p. 72). All the contributors know this. But acknowledgment would seem to necessitate rewriting many passages that attribute influence to Weininger. Moving to the culture side, Weininger (and Schopenhauer) influenced Kraus (who influenced Wittgenstein). So the Wittgenstein-reads-Weininger case is one in which threads are too fine and too entangled to be teased apart by the regrettably limited means at our disposal.

Once we admit and appreciate the influence of 'Wittgenstein's Vienna', in a diffuse sort of way, at how many specific points does Wittgenstein-as-Weiningerian clearly carry us further? I wish the contributors to this volume had been a bit more skeptical, in this vein, on behalf of their readers. It would have been more clarifying than deflating of the merits of the subject.

Janik's title, "Weininger and the Two Wittgensteins", points the way to yet another problem: there are more than two Wittgensteins in the secondary literature. This might seem too obvious to mention. But Wittgenstein's works are unusually susceptible to the placement of perilous '∼ 's, to adapt the man's judgment on Weininger to himself. The later Wittgenstein negates the early. (Or there is secret continuity.) The early Wittgenstein negates the early. (So many competing methods of ladder disposal.) For that matter, the later negates the later. The message of both the Tractatus and Philosophical Investigations is that they themselves are somehow trivial. They reveal how nothing important can be achieved by philosophy.

Coordinating (∼)Weininger and (∼)Wittgenstein is a daunting combinatoric exercise. Here is one rather humble illustration. Stern and Szabados quote (p. 10) Wittgenstein's remark that he considered using a line from King Lear as a motto for Philosophical Investigations: "I will teach you differences." They interpret this, reasonably, as expressing 'anti-essentialism', which they more boldly speculate Wittgenstein may have derived in somewhat complex fashion from Weininger, who posits Platonic essential types – Male and Female – but also acknowledges infinite gradations between; infinite differences. (I am stating the point a bit baldly.)

One concern, as per above, is that Wittgenstein's interest in 'differences' has too many potential roots. But apart from that, let me raise a puzzle about the Lear line. In its native language-game, its use is not what we might assume. Kent shouts 'I'll teach you differences!' to Goneril's manservant, Oswald, who has been insolent to Lear. So the line means: 'I'll teach you to respect the essential difference between high and low, low dog!' The lesson consists of a kick out the door, delivered with the words: "Have you wisdom? So!" (A beating constitutes a disproof, by example, of Oswald's arrogant "I'll not be beat!")

Wittgenstein knows the dramatic context. (There is even a conversation with Drury about proper delivery of lines from Lear. Wittgenstein has seen the play.) I suspect, then, the proposal of this motto expresses a complex irony. Wittgenstein's view is that what is truly important exists along a high/low axis -- ethically, artistically, religiously. Yet philosophy properly occupies the flat, horizontal plane of the 'city of language', over which we struggle to achieve a 'perspicuous view'. One can quote chapter and verse from Philosophical Investigations on the importance of 'difference' -- grammatical distinctions, gradations of family resemblance. But not differences of high and low, better and worse. The sense of depth in philosophy is an illusion -- no deeper than a grammatical joke (PI, 111). Likewise, there is no commanding height. Philosophy does not prescribe, merely describes. "It leaves everything as it is" (PI, 123). A most un-Kent-like volume, Philosophical Investigations. I take it Kent's line suited Wittgenstein because it seems to say something that fits the text straightforwardly yet in dramatic context means its negation; which secretly fits what the text is trying to show concerning its own inadequacy. To quote the Nestroy motto we have actually got: 'The thing about progress is that there is always less of it than it seems.' In other words, 'Have you wisdom? So!' The Oswald-like philosopher gets a knock for arrogantly climbing above his proper station.

Which is not to pry Wittgenstein off Weininger. (I think Oswald is a fine candidate for analysis as a paradigm of the criminal-type, in Weininger's sense). My view of Wittgenstein differs from Szabados', so I would do the Wittgenstein-Weininger mapping differently (if caught in a speculative mood.) Szabados says there are, in Wittgenstein's eyes, two Weiningers: the good, anti-essentialist one --the yolk --and the bad, scientistic, essentializing one-- the eggshells. Wittgenstein is nourished by the former, brushes off the latter. I would say, to the contrary, that the later Wittgenstein never regards essence negatively, merely as philosophically inexpressible or unattainable (which reflects badly on philosophy, not essence.) So I would speculate that Wittgenstein admires Weininger's essentialism --his proper yearning for yolk --yet feels he (and Weininger) get left with the shells. Wittgenstein is better than Weininger only in recognizing empty verbal husks for what they are.

For good measure, I could carry the argument over into Daniel Steuer's essay, "Uncanny Differences: Wittgenstein and Weininger". Steuer makes an interesting connection between Weininger's notion that "chance is absolutely un-tragic" (quote, p. 146) and an odd remark by Wittenstein that, 'in his world' there is no tragedy. "Everything, so to speak, can be dissolved into the ether (of the world); there is no hardness. This means that hardness & conflict do not become something splendid but a defect" (quote, p. 141-2). Steuer concludes that Wittgenstein rejects tragedy; that Wittgenstein's ideal philosopher is like Weininger's criminal-type (who rejects tragedy by refusing to acknowledge hard limits, logically or ethically.) I would say, to the contrary, that Wittgenstein infers the valuelessness (not incorrectness) of his own philosophy from its untragic cast. In general, from the fact that Wittgenstein cannot see himself as Lear, it does not follow he sees himself as Oswald. Weininger worried that if he could not be a genius-hero -- like Beethoven -- he would be a criminal; for him there were no stable points between. Wittgenstein clearly shares some such extreme ethical anxiety, hence might be read as negating Weininger by laboriously constructing a stable middle position. Neither high nor low; the flat plane of language and philosophy. (Trivial, but at least not criminal.)

Not that you need to take my word for it. My views about Wittgenstein are unorthodox. The present point is that if I can map my Wittgenstein onto Weininger my way; if Szabados and Steuer can map their Wittgenstein onto Weininger their way well, then, our shared scholarly world is shaping up as one in which there is a lamentable (not to say tragic) lack of 'hardness'.

Wittgenstein once criticized a proposed definition of 'the good' -- 'Good is what it is right to admire':

The definition throws no light. There are three concepts, all of them vague. Imagine three solid pieces of stone. You pick them up, fit then together and you get now a ball. What you've now got tells you something about the three shapes. Now consider you have three balls of or lumps of soft mud or putty --formless. Now you put the three together and mold out of them a ball. Ewing [the definer] makes a soft ball out of three pieces of mud.[2]

The contributors to this volume have their bits of direct evidence -- five lumps of mud, plus an indeterminate quantity of semi-solid thematic substance. It goes without saying we may form some soft ball. What good will it do us? Laying down this challenge in term of the volume's front matter: "Hitherto the nature of Weininger's philosophical influence on Wittgenstein has remained a matter of speculation. The purpose of this new collection of essays is to explore the various ways in which Wittgenstein absorbed and responded to Weininger's ideas." To the contrary, this volume serves to show that hereafter the question must remain a matter of speculation. What, then, can the purpose of this volume be?

First there is genuine need for a 'perspicuous overview' of the sprawling city of Wittgenstein's influences. (So many problems in Wittgenstein scholarship have the form, 'I don't know my way around.') I once considered teaching a "Schopenhauer, Russell, Frege" class, the point being to qualify students to read and understand the Tractatus; the joke being that such a class sounds odd. A grander hodge-podge would be a "Boltzmann, Hertz, Schopenhauer, Frege, Russell, Kraus, Loos, Weininger, Spengler, Sraffa" tour, with G.E. Moore and the Vienna Circle thrown in for good measure. It seems Wittgenstein's status should, by rights, retroactively constitute this lot as a coherent philosophical sub-discipline. But Moore and Kraus? Schopenhauer and Frege? The conjunctions remain incongruous. The flow of Wittgenstein debates can boil angrily around such points. Crudely, there is the Anglo-American Wittgenstein versus the Viennese-Continental one. More radically, there is the 'strayed poet' Wittgenstein (to borrow the title of a poem about Wittgenstein by I. A. Richards) versus the technical or argumentative Wittgenstein. One rule in these tug-of-war matches seems to be that everyone leans too far one way or the other. Thus, Wittgenstein is a philosopher whose discipline-defying influences cause even devoted scholars to subsist on one-sided diets of interpretive possibility.

In a dietary sense, what most scholarly readers will need from Wittgenstein Reads Weininger are Weininger 'vitamins', easy to consume and digest. Scholars need to nibble a little, which needs to be enough for them to judge independently whether they could use more. It seems to me the volume half-succeeds in this regard. No contributor offers a 'for beginners' synopsis of the contents of Weininger's two works, which I think would have been useful. On the other hand, the editors' introduction provides cultural and biographical background; they summarize the history of Wittgenstein-Weininger scholarship; they briskly summarize the contents of all the contributors' essays, which are clear and accessible.

The volume is least flattered by direct philosophical light. How does Weininger help us understand and assess works like the Tractatus and Philosophical Investigations? Are there cases in which the balance between competing textual interpretations is tipped? Are there cases in which the balance between accepting or rejecting an argument, thesis, perspective is tipped? The contributors do not say 'no and no', but they make no clear affirmative answers. No essays in the volume directly address themselves to questions of this basic form. Consider, for example, the conclusion of Janik's essay: "Thus we arrive at the point where Wittgenstein meets Weininger. For both of them, philosophical problems can only be eliminated on the basis of what Pascal calls a change of heart, that is a change in our comportment: 'Difficulty of philosophy, not the intellectual difficulty of science but the difficulty of conversion. Resistance of the will has to be overcome'" (p. 84). But we already know Wittgenstein thinks this -- roughly -- if we have read him with moderate care. What remains is to work out what this means, whether it makes sense, whether it is compelling as a vision of the nature of philosophy. Janik's essay really only gets us to the starting line. (On the other hand, I find the thematic parallels Janik draws between Weininger and Wittgenstein to be interesting and suggestive of genuine influence, for what it may be worth.)

The volume is strongest when driving home, repeatedly, the point that Wittgenstein is, as the editors say, a "confessional" thinker whose work "breaks down the distinction between the personal and the philosophical" (p. 15-6). Wittgestein is always working on himself, literally. Joachim Schulte discusses, for example, the common illusion that Wittgenstein is our surprising contemporary -- is like us. Schulte recommends Weininger as therapy. He is not like us, yet we come to see his family resemblance to Wittgenstein. Schulte compares this to the difficulty of tolerating a lot of old-fashioned furniture in a sleek, modernist environment. "But if you find it hard to combine them, you should remember that without those time-bound objects we should never have had these no doubt more gratifying works, which, after all, responded to earlier developments and may, in some barely visible crannies, show traces if not influences of what they responded to" (p. 132). Eggshells in the modernist upholstery. (But this is no argument for keeping the unsightly stuff on view, is it?) "It is possible to study the history of a building and its construction with a view to seeing it better" (p. 22), say the editors. This is not wrong but it is a stock sentiment; something more carefully tailored to suit the odd proportions of this case is needed.

Let me hint at a proper line of justification for the project -- one I am sure is more or less what the contributors have in mind, but I do not find it articulated clearly. Wittgenstein's philosophy is technical, early and late. It must be read for its sharp, argumentative edges. Yet Wittgenstein says technical problems do not engage him. He says he 'poetizes', that his problems are always personal, ethical, aesthetic, religious. This is deeply puzzling. But perhaps we can begin to square this circle with help from papers like David Stern's "Weininger and Wittgenstein on 'Animal Psychology'" (which I found the best of the lot).

Here we get, first, clear summary of a chapter from On Last Things, containing eccentric semiotic notions passed off as "Metaphysics". (The dog is the symbol of the criminal; the horse of madness. Everywhere we look, we see ourselves, for the macrocosm is the microcosm.) Second, reasonable summary of Wittgenstein's discussion of problems in the philosophy of mind in terms of puzzles concerning attribution of propositional attitudes and intentionally to animals. Though I cannot explain briefly, odd harmonies are audible when these vastly different philosophical instruments are sounded side by side. I am convinced it is no accident that these two voices fit together. But what does this duet say.

I would not say our assessment of the validity or value of Wittgenstein's philosophy of mind is likely to be affected by its coordination with Weiningerian animal semiotics. What we come away with is a surprisingly altered sense of why Wittgenstein cared. Weininger philosophizes with intoxicated eccentricity by way of arriving at vast ethical conclusions. When Wittgenstein covers the same ground soberly -- like a good analytic philosopher -- he arrives at no ethical result; but this is, plausibly, negative commentary; reproach to Weininger.

It is difficult to do justice to the potential significance of this style of reading Wittgenstein, not because the significance is vast, though it may be, but because it is so equivocal. In Philosophical Investigations Wittgenstein discusses the doubtful significance of the sense that "every familiar word, in a book for example, actually carries an atmosphere with it in our minds, a 'corona' of lightly indicated uses" (PI, p. 181). I think it would be fair to say that all the contributors to this volume are primarily striving to cultivate their --hence our -- sense of a corona of lightly indicated Weiningerian uses around the familiar words in Wittgenstein's books. I have already made the point that the strained speculative eye starts seeing things. David Stern quotes a relevant line from Lichtenberg: "certainly experiment and reflection enable us to introduce a significance into what is not legible, either to us or at all: thus we see faces or landscapes in the sand, though they are certainly not there" (quoted, p. 171). But the really fundamental question is: why does it matter? Suppose we acquire a strong sense of this 'corona' -- this eggshell of private, idiosyncratic association. What good is it, if it does not demonstrably affect our assessment of Wittgenstein's arguments in works like Philosophical Investigations?

On the other hand, it seems to be a singular fact about Wittgenstein -- something that genuinely sets him off from most other philosophers -- that it is most biographically plausible that even when we understand what he is saying, we may be radically in the dark about why he says it, why he finds it significant, what leads him to it; who or what he is addressing, hearkening to, agreeing with or resisting. He surely falls victim to misplaced interpretive charity-- which seems a public misfortune -- because he is the sort of philosopher to say things like, "It is impossible for me to say in my book [Philosophical Investigations] one word about all that music has meant in my life. How then can I hope to be understood?"[3] But most interpreters remain too sober --and rightly so -- to hazard that a given passage that says nothing about music may secretly be directed at the meaning of music. So Wittgenstein may end up more than a bit like the Grumbler, in Kraus' The Last Days of Mankind:

My ear hears noises that others don't hear, and these noises disturb the music of the spheres for me, something else others don't hear. Think that over, and then if you still don't come to a conclusion by yourself, call me. I like to converse with you, you supply the key words for my monologues. I would like to go before the public with you. As of now I can only say to them that I am remaining silent, and if possible, what I am remaining silent about.[4]

If this is a tolerable portrait of Wittgenstein -- as a solipsistically silent monologist superficially engaged in public, technical philosophical debate by means of the usual keywords (mind, meaning, logic, language) -- it is hard to believe this fact is of no philosophical relevance to philosophers and scholars interested in Wittgenstein. But it remains hard to make out the relevance. The if dangles like the sword of Damocles. I sympathize with the difficulties the contributors to this volume have inevitably encountered, trying to work this lock they cannot quite see by means of the glassy key of Weininger's influence. What they have written is interesting. I wish I could do better than that myself.


CV Culture and Value. Translated by P. Winch. Edited by G. H. von Wright. Chicago: Chicago UP, 1980/1998.

PG Philosophical Grammar. Translated by Anthony Kenny. Edited by Rush Rhees. Oxford: Blackwell, 1974.

PI Philosophical Investigations. Translated by G. E. M. Anscombe. Edited by G. E. M. Anscombe and Rush Rhees. 3rd ed. Oxford: Blackwell, 1953.

[1] M. O'C. Drury, "Some Notes on Conversations with Wittgenstein", in Recollections of Wittgenstein, ed. R. Rhees (Oxford: Oxford UP, 1984), p. 106.

[2] O. K. Bouwsma, Wittgenstein: Conversations, 1949-1951, ed. J. L. Craft and R. E. Hustwit (Indianapolos: Hackett, 1986), p. 42

[3] Drury, "Conversations With Wittgenstein", p. 160.

[4] Karl Kraus, The Last Days of Mankind, ed. F. Ungar, trans. A. Gode and S. E. Wright (New York: Ungar, 1974), p. 70.