Wittgenstein's Early Philosophy

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José L. Zalabardo (ed.), Wittgenstein's Early Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 264pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199691524.

Reviewed by Hao Tang, Wuhan University


This is overall a nice collection of nine original essays on Wittgenstein's early philosophy. They are divided into three equal groups, each centered on one area: Judgment, Objects, and Method. (The division is not sharp.) The center of attention is of course the Tractatus, but Wittgenstein's writings both before and after the Tractatus are also discussed. Many essays are close engagements with Wittgenstein, but also provide lessons for contemporary discussions. There is a brief introduction by the editor (who also contributes an essay).

In chapter 1, Colin Johnston ("Russell, Wittgenstein, and Synthesis in Thought") offers an account of the precise nature of Wittgenstein's encounters with Russell around 1913, which led Russell to abandon work on a major manuscript on theory of knowledge. (Johnston's phrase "synthesis in thought" is derived only from Russell, so one should not expect discussion of Kant.)

Johnston's main line is that Russell's work around 1913 on the general theory of complexes and constituents committed him to an extremely permissive principle of substitutability ((S)). I shall not reproduce Johnston's (S) here. Suffice it to note the extent of its permissiveness: (S) permits, in the example of Othello's judgment that Desdemona loves Cassio, the substitution of love (a relation) for Iago (a particular). This floods the pool of candidate contents of judgment with nonsense, leading Russell to abandon his multiple relation theory of judgment. The role of Wittgenstein in this, Johnston says, was to make Russell clearly realize his commitment to (S), despite his [Russell's] deviations from it. So what Wittgenstein did was in effect to make Russell firm up his commitment to (S), and this made a casualty of his theory of judgment.

Johnston acknowledges (n. 16, pp. 32-33) that his account of how Wittgenstein caused Russell to abandon his multiple relation theory of judgment is contentious. I shall only say that, as an amateur, I also feel that it is not crystal clear in Johnston's account why Russell's commitment to (S) is supposed to have been so deep.

Peter Hanks's "Early Wittgenstein on Judgment" (chapter 2) is a rich, lucid, and stimulating essay on how Wittgenstein's view on judgment evolved from the Notes on Logic to the Tractatus. Hanks's approach is to link this evolution to the evolution of Wittgenstein's view on the contents of judgments, namely (the senses of) propositions. This approach fits very nicely with Wittgenstein's remark, strategically quoted by Hanks (p. 40), that his objection to Russell's multiple relation theory of judgment can be met only by a correct account of propositions. What Wittgenstein pursued, on Hanks's account, was a middle path between overstressing the unity of the content of a judgment and overstressing the multiplicity of its elements. I shall raise one issue about Hanks's main theme, i.e., the evolution of Wittgenstein's view on judgment.

The most salient feature in this evolution is that the judging subject, while recognized in Notes on Logic, is in a certain sense eliminated in the Tractatus. This elimination is very salient in 5.542, where Wittgenstein says that the form of "A judges or says p" is "'p' says p". For on this account, the judging subject, A, has disappeared. The reason for this disappearance, Hanks suggests, is that Wittgenstein came to realize that "the subject term in sentences about judgment and belief must signify something with the logical complexity of a sentence" (p. 50). The judging subject is logically simple (pp. 49-50) and so lacks complexity. This deprives it of any capacity to judge, because the requirement of an isomorphism between the content of judgment and whatever bears the duty of judging cannot be met.

This line of thought is surely in Wittgenstein and Hanks explains it well, but he seems to ignore a crucial issue. Hanks says that "Roughly speaking, the theory of judgment in the Tractatus is an account of how judgment sentences report occurrences of mental sentences" (p. 58) and spells out such an account in detail. In the process he makes frequent and apparently essential references to the judging subject A ("a mental sentence . . . occurs in A", "A's mental sentence", and "A's thought" on p. 58). But isn't the judging subject supposed to disappear according to 5.542? This seems to be a real difference between the Tractatus and Hanks's account of it. (I will say more about these issues when I comment on chapter 6

Chapter 3 is Stewart Candlish and Nic Damnjanovic's "The Tractatus and the Unity of the Proposition". They approach "the problem of the unity of the proposition" by breaking it down into a family of problems and then examining how Wittgenstein dealt with them. Their investigation is intended to also be helpful for evaluating contemporary Tractatus-inspired approaches in the same topical area.

Candlish and Damnjanovic's overall verdict is that much of Wittgenstein's account of the unity of propositions ultimately rests on his "doctrine" that certain features of language cannot be said but only shown. They find this "doctrine" very unsatisfying and thus requiring a "steep price" that Tractatus-inspired approaches may have to pay. This dismissal of Wittgenstein's "doctrine" of the ineffable strikes me as rather too quick. Reasons for the dismissal are given in just one page (p. 95) and there is no engagement with non-doctrinal readings of the Tractatus. But the essay also contains much discussion that is fairly independent from the dismissal. I shall raise one issue.

Candlish and Damnjanovic argue (on pp. 81-86) that for the Tractatus propositions are not essentially or intrinsically representational. Propositions of themselves do not say anything or have significance. It is rather our use of propositional signs as pictures in projective relations to the world that makes them significant or representational. There is certainly something right about this stress on use. But Candlish and Damnjanovic's account of how use gives significance is disputable. On their view, "the possibility of our using propositional signs as pictures relies on our setting up correlations between names and objects, and also setting up conventions about how the relations between names are to be understood" (pp. 84-85), and the correlations of names with objects are set up "arbitrarily or conventionally" (p. 81). But assigning such a fundamental role to arbitrary conventions faces serious interpretative difficulties. The main difficulty is as follows. A name has meaning [Bedeutung] only in the context of a proposition (3.3), and its only context is an elementary proposition (4.23). So to determine the meanings of names (to correlate names with objects), we need to have elementary propositions. How are we to arrive at these? Wittgenstein does not say much (which left an opening seized by the positivists). But he is at least clear about the general kind of activity that is needed, namely "the application of logic" (5.557). Whatever the precise meaning of this remark, it seems clear that determining the meanings of names is not just a matter of arbitrary convention, because there is nothing conventional or arbitrary about the application of logic.

To be fair, it is not at all easy to spell out how "the application of logic" is supposed to yield elementary propositions and therewith correlations between names and objects. But Candlish and Damnjanovic's confidence in taking the "correlation by convention" interpretation seems rather too bland. (I say more on these issues later when I comment on chapter 5.)

In "Simple Objects: Complex Questions", Hans Sluga discusses Wittgenstein's idea of simples. He focuses heavily on the pre-Tractatus writings and lightly on the Tractatus. Sluga traces Wittgenstein's evolving ideas by quoting and interpreting (sometimes liberally) passages from the pre-Tractatus notes. Although he makes some interesting points, his treatment is unconvincing overall. Details aside, a general ground for this assessment is that two of Sluga's summaries of his account of Wittgenstein's idea of simples contradict each other. In both summaries, Sluga is contrasting his account with Hidé Ishiguro's well-known one. His first summary is:

Ishiguro . . . writes that the concept of a simple object 'was a logical requisite for the Tractatus theory, and followed from the combination of a basically correct theory about names, of a mistaken assimilation of complex things and facts, and of a wrong and unnecessary claim about the independence of elementary propositions' which Wittgenstein abandoned 'in later years'. I have sought to lay out a number of other reasons for Wittgenstein's attachment to simple objects. In my account, the doctrine of the logical independence of elementary propositions plays no particular part. (pp. 114-115)

Given the last sentence, it seems appropriate to take Sluga to mean by "other reasons" that he thinks the reasons why Wittgenstein committed himself to simples were other than, not in addition to, the logical independence of elementary propositions (INDEP). That is, Sluga thinks INDEP was not a reason why Wittgenstein committed himself to simples. But just this point is contradicted in Sluga's second summary:

I hope to have shown that Wittgenstein's doctrine of simple objects was built on a wide range of considerations and was not just rooted in a 'wrong and unnecessary claim about the independence of elementary propositions', as Ishiguro has it. (p. 116)

Sluga's words "not just" make it hard to avoid attributing to him the view that INDEP was one of Wittgenstein's reasons for simples (though not the only one). This makes it very unclear whether Sluga thinks INDEP is one such reason or no such reason at all. (What is clear is that INDEP plays little role in his account, as he says himself.) There is also another inconsistency: the second summary saddles Ishiguro with the view that INDEP was Wittgenstein's only reason for simples. This view is not only implausible but also flatly inconsistent with Ishiguro's view quoted by Sluga himself in his first summary. Perhaps these inconsistences are only verbal, but their occurrence certainly does not inspire confidence.

 José Zalabardo's guiding question in "Reference, Simplicity, and Necessary Existence in the Tractatus" can be put: how did Wittgenstein argue to the conclusion that there must be simple, necessarily existing objects? Zalabardo's answer is: he did not really argue his way to it, but held it as a basic and pre-existing conviction for which he was only "struggling to support with arguments", an exercise that continued after the conviction had disappeared (p. 149).

Zalabardo's main argument for this answer can be summed up as follows. An argument for simples, the Empty-Name Argument, is very commonly attributed to Wittgenstein, including in PI, §39. But this attribution is not really supported (and Wittgenstein's apparent later self-attribution is only apparent). The main basis for this contention is that a passage that is key for the attribution, 2.0211 and 2.0212, does not really support the attribution and this is in turn because this passage should not be read as a premise in the Empty-Name Argument but rather as Wittgenstein's solution to a Russellian problem, namely the problem of accommodating false propositions. Zalabardo's suggestion that Wittgenstein really had no argument for simples is surely provocative. His argument for this is quite intricate and contains interesting points. I shall raise two issues here.

One issue concerns a thesis crucial for Zalabardo's argument against the attribution: that, according to the Tractatus, propositions have their senses contingently (pp. 123-125). Zalabardo's ground for this thesis is a particular claim about how names get correlated with objects (he concentrates on elementary propositions): name-object correlations (called proxy mapping) result from arbitrary stipulations (p. 125). The phrase "results from" bears emphasis. Zalabardo is not blandly claiming, as Candlish and Damnjanovic do in chapter 3, that correlating names with objects just is a matter of arbitrary stipulations. Rather, it results from them. As Zalabardo points out, his claim

does not entail that the stipulations concern in the first instance what names are paired with. More likely, the stipulations would concern complex signs and yield as consequences the pairings of names with their images under the proxy mapping (p. 125, n. 11).

I agree that this is more likely, but then the question is: must the arbitrariness attaching to complex signs carry over, in the process of yielding the said consequences, to simple signs (i.e., names), so that the name-object correlations are infected with arbitrariness, thereby making the senses of elementary propositions contingent? Zalabardo's line of argument seems to need a "Yes", but it is not obvious that a "Yes" is required by the Tractatus. For though Wittgenstein stresses the arbitrariness or conventionality of signs (perhaps to prevent us from mistaking accidental features of the notation for its essential features), he also stresses that beyond a certain point there is nothing arbitrary about signs or notations: see, e.g., 3.342, 3.3442, and 6.124. In particular, he denies that analysis, the process of resolving signs for complexes in order to arrive at signs for simples, is arbitrary (3.3442). But this process of analysis seems to be exactly the process of "yield[ing] as consequences the pairings of names with their images under the proxy mapping" that Zalabardo speaks of. So while we may begin with arbitrary signs for complexes, the subsequent process of analysis is not at all arbitrary. So it is not obvious that arbitrariness must spread from complex signs and infect simple signs (thereby making senses contingent).

Another issue concerns Zalabardo's treatment of PI, §39, the passage that he quotes as containing the Empty-Name Argument (pp. 119-120). Because he is against attributing this argument to the early Wittgenstein, he has to explain why Wittgenstein's apparent self-criticism in §39 is only apparent. But his explanation is unsatisfactory. It is done in two steps. The first is a detour through Wittgenstein's criticism of the Augustinian picture of meaning: Zalabardo says that §39 is part of that criticism and Wittgenstein saw the Tractatus as Augustinian (p. 120). This detour is later invoked in Zalabardo's second step, where he very quickly dismisses §39 as targeting the Tractatus, saying that many aspects of the Augustinian picture are surely not in the Tractatus. and then giving two examples of such aspects, i.e., treating 'this' as a name and assigning a role to ostensive definitions (p. 148). But this procedure obviously does not show that the Empty-Name Argument is not some other aspect of the Augustinian picture. Even if we assumes this, we can conclude that the argument is not a target of Wittgenstein's self-criticism only if we further assume that his self-criticism is completely confined to what is Augustinian in his early work. Zalabardo writes as if both assumptions were obvious, but neither of them seems obvious, especially in the absence of any attempt by him to specify the sense in which he takes the Tractatus to be Augustinian.

Cora Diamond's general aim in "What Can You Do with the General Propositional Form?" is to show that the apparently austere and rigid "extensionalist" account of language in the Tractatus can actually accommodate a lot of the richness and flexibility of ordinary language. That is, she wants to show in detail that Wittgenstein was quite justified in saying that ordinary language is in perfect logical order as it stands (5.5563), or at least justified up to a higher point than is often thought (Diamond does acknowledge that there are serious problems in the account of language in the Tractatus). This accommodation is, as one would expect of Diamond, carried out within a 'resolute' reading the Tractatus.

The main specific feature of ordinary language that Diamond tries to accommodate is the form "A says p". She also wants to accommodate the sort of generality involved in such sentences as "Everything the Pope says is true". (It is in handling the "every" in such sentences that the general propositional form comes in.) A little reflection on this kind of sentence should make one realize the scale of Diamond's project: she is trying to accommodate a very large portion of what we sometimes call semantic discourse. Indeed, she includes an account of the truth predicate, of translation (ordinary translation, not radical translation), and of the projective relations that propositional signs bear to reality. Diamond also fits in an account of the falsity predicate (her favored example is "Every proposition asserted by Cheney is false"), thereby integrating the N-operator, the generalized negation operator in the Tractatus.

It is in some such complex fashion that Diamond tries, heroically, to locate semantic discourse within the Tractatus. There is much that is insightful in her rich essay. Here I shall raise just one issue. It concerns her treatment of the "Cheney [or A] says . . . " operator (her favored example is "Cheney [or A] says that William defeated Harold"). This treatment constitutes by far the longest section of her essay (Section 4, 17 pages) and seems to me the heart of it.

Diamond, like Hanks, makes frequent and seemingly essential references to the judging subject while explaining Wittgenstein's idea that the form of "A says p" is "'p' says p" (5.542), despite the fact that that idea appears designed to eliminate the subject. The difference is that while Hanks's references are always explicit, Diamond moves freely between formulations that make explicit references and those that do not. For instance, on p. 174 she moves without ceremony from "'William' was uttered by A" to simply "'William' was uttered" (added emphasis). A page later she moves, again without ceremony, from "'William' is uttered" to "'William' is uttered from Cheney's mouth" (added emphasis).

But this practice of letting Cheney (or A, the schematic judger) drop in and out freely can be justified only if we treat the formulations that contain no explicit references to Cheney as containing implicit references to him. For if there is not even implicit reference to Cheney, the relevant sign-fact (sign-facts are facts used to say things), i.e., the fact that 'William' was uttered before and 'Harold' after 'defeated', becomes untethered from Cheney (in the way a signed letter becomes untethered from its author when the signature is blotted out). It is thereby made very unclear, to say the least, why the sign-fact reports an assertion by Cheney (or, for that matter, by anyone at all).

The point can be dramatized with a gerrymandered example. Suppose, in some same breath of time in 1917, Frege in Jena uttered "William is not a horse", Wittgenstein in the trenches uttered "We defeated the Russians", and Russell in England uttered "I pity Harold", thus jointly producing the fact that 'William' was uttered before and 'Harold' after 'defeated' (in quick succession if one pleases). But, of course, whatever capacity it is that enables us to see that the Cheney-utterance-fact (the fact that he uttered those words) reports an assertion by him, the same capacity enables us to see that the above gerrymandered utterance-fact reports no assertion at all.

It is hard to see how we can rule out such wrong utterance-facts without reference, explicit or implicit, to Cheney. But if references to concrete speakers are unavoidable, it is hard to see how Diamond can do justice to Wittgenstein's apparent elimination of such references in 5.542. Diamond does not consider this problem but simply assumes the availability of personal names. This assumption is correct in itself, but it is another matter whether we can make it on behalf of the Tractatus.

Personal names and their associated forms (e.g., "Who said that?", "Russell said that") play an enormously important role in ordinary language. Perhaps part of that role (i.e., the first person singular) can be interpreted as being preserved, in sublimed fashion, in the metaphysical subject in 5.6s. But even so, it remains difficult to accommodate the roles of other grammatical persons and concrete personal names. The difficulty is that while understanding ordinary language seems inseparable from understanding persons, the Tractatus does not seem an accommodating place for persons (a genuine plurality of self-conscious subjects).

Michael Kremer's aim, in "Russell's Merit", is to fully understand Wittgenstein's remark that "Russell's merit is to have shown that the apparent logical form of the proposition need not be its real form" in 4.0031. He breaks the task down into three questions. (1) Why is Russell (rather than, say, Frege or Hertz) singled out for praise? (2) How is this praise an elaboration on 4.003 (rather than 4.002), as indicated by Wittgenstein's numbering system? (3) How is Russell's merit connected to Wittgenstein's idea, expressed in 4.0031, that philosophy is a 'critique of language'? The latter two questions, Kremer rightly notes, are closely connected to Wittgenstein's critique of nonsense. He argues that a seemingly obvious and common interpretation of "Russell's merit" fails to adequately answer these three questions and proposes an interpretation of his own. He finds the key in Russell's treatment of logical puzzles in "On Denoting", especially the puzzle about "The present King of France is bald". Kremer's main claim is that Russell, in resolving the puzzle, provided an important tool for uncovering philosophical nonsense.

The puzzle, as Kremer formulates it (p. 224), is that "The King of France is bald" ((B) in Kremer) and "The King of France is not bald" ((C)) seem to be both false (since we will not find the King of France among either bald things or non-bald things). But this seems to violate the law of excluded middle. Russell's solution was to say that there is an ambiguity in (C). (The ambiguity, Kremer helpfully points out, is subtle: it is in the logical form of the proposition, not in any particular word.) Informally, the ambiguity is between (C1) and (C2):

(C1) There is one and only one King of France and he is not bald.

(C2) It is not the case that (there is one and only one King of France and he is bald).

Kremer then argues as follows. Because (C) is ambiguous, it has no determinate sense. But to have no determinate sense is to have no sense at all. So (C) stands revealed as a piece of nonsense. In this way Russell served philosophy as a 'critique of language'.

I have reservations about Kremer's argument, but this is not the place to register them. His essay is very carefully researched, patient, and informative. The attention to detail is admirable. The details also help Kremer place his interpretation of "Russell's merit" within (his version of) a 'therapeutic' reading of the Tractatus.

In "Naturalism and 'Turning our Examination Round", Marie McGinn's concern is the fundamental shift in Wittgenstein's thinking about language from an earlier "tendency to sublime the logic of our language" (PI, §38) to a later earth-bound vision of language as a specifically human form of life, in particular as part of "the natural history of human beings" (PI, §415). She also helpfully connects this self-criticism of Wittgenstein to his later attack on the idea of acts of the mind as "remarkable" or "occult" processes (though her reading of 3.11 as expressing this idea on p. 246 seems too quick). McGinn rightly presents the change in Wittgenstein as at once philosophical and methodological: the changes in methods are part and parcel of the basic change in vision. Her essay contains numerous helpful references to specific areas where Wittgenstein's later methods are at work. Its chief value is to provide a broad guide to reading the later Wittgenstein against the background of his earlier way of thinking.

I shall register a slight disappointment and raise an issue. The slight disappointment is that McGinn, despite the word "naturalism" in her title, gives little detailed discussion of how Wittgenstein's turn is "naturalistic". She rightly reads Wittgenstein's turn as a turn toward our everyday practices with words, but there is little discussion about how these practices are part of the natural history of human beings. But perhaps one should not expect such discussion in a broad guide.

The issue I want to raise goes deeper. It concerns McGinn's reading of part of PI, §95 as expressing the subliming tendency. The part of §95 she discusses is:

"Thought must be something unique". When we say, and mean, that such-and-such is the case, we -- and our meaning -- do not stop short of the fact; but we mean: this -- is -- so. (p. 244)

McGinn reads Wittgenstein as using this whole passage, both the quoted first sentence and the unquoted second sentence, to express the subliming tendency. In other words, she treats both sentences as not in Wittgenstein's own voice. Any doubt about this will be removed by the fact that McGinn later quotes these sentences separately as each expressing the subliming tendency (p. 246 and p. 247).

This treatment is questionable. Textually, the natural reading is to treat the unquoted second sentence as in Wittgenstein's own voice. But this textual point is somewhat moot, because McGinn could have made most of her points without discussing §95. However, there is a more serious issue.

What the unquoted sentence says, if we treat it as in Wittgenstein's own voice, is that our speech and thought do not fall short of the facts. That is, our minds, the minds of speaking animals, do get a grip on reality, at least sometimes. This is really commonsense. More importantly here, keeping this piece of commonsense is crucial for naturalizing minds in a later-Wittgensteinian spirit, i.e., for gaining a conception of nature that is suitable for locating minded animals such as ourselves in the whole of nature as a dwelling place (rather than as a bald, alien environment). This is of course the project of John McDowell's naturalism, which McGinn herself mentions in connection with the kind of naturalism in the later Wittgenstein. But since (1) a crucial plank of this naturalism is that our minds do have a genuine grip on reality and (2) it is textually eminently possible to read (as McDowell actually does) the unquoted second sentence of §95 as reminding us of exactly this grip, McGinn's treatment of this sentence seems to miss a philosophical opportunity.

Again, the issue here is not merely textual: McGinn and McDowell could have made their points without discussing §95. McGinn, like McDowell, is rightly concerned to de-sublime logic and minds, to render them not magical or enchanted, but human and ordinary. But she seems not alive to a possible need to retain some enchantment, or to partially re-enchant nature as McDowell urges. To put it in Cavellian terms, she seems not alive to the extraordinariness of the ordinary. If so, this seems to me a pity in a reader of the later Wittgenstein.

In Brian McGuinness's "Two Cheers for the 'New' Wittgenstein?" the weight of the question mark is on the scare-quoted 'New'. McGuinness voices doubts about the claim to novelty made by "the New Wittgensteinians". (By this he seems to mean the contributors, minus Peter Hacker, to The New Wittgenstein, edited by Alice Crary and Rupert Read.) The 'novelty', McGuinness suggests, is at least partly due to some falseness in the New Wittgensteinians' construction of their target. But he also makes the friendlier point that the complexity of Wittgenstein and the diverse interests of different readers are bound to generate discovery, or rediscovery, of 'new' insights in Wittgenstein. It would seem that, polemics aside, it does not really matter whether one discovers or rediscovers insights in Wittgenstein (or in anyone). What really matters is that one has personally won the insights.

McGuinness might agree, since he rightly stresses that behind Wittgenstein's difficult style is a "desire to bring the reader into discussion and make him go through all the hoops" (p. 262). The element of personal struggle is essential. McGuinness helpfully points out in this connection that for Wittgenstein being personal does not mean there is no real relation with others. Quite the contrary: being personal means, on occasion, taking the other person by the throat and insisting on a real relation rather than an artificially limited one (p. 264). One source of artificial limitation McGuinness touches on is bourgeois mentality: a superficial simplicity and a lack of nose for important truths in improbable places (p. 268).

By now it should be no surprise that McGuinness emphasizes, surely rightly, that for Wittgenstein the really important truths or insights are as much ethical as intellectual. The "philosophic insight" that "we are not masters of everything but survey things from within a whole that we cannot define" has at once an ethical and an intellectual aspect (p. 267). Indeed, the ethical aspect is, for Wittgenstein at least, incomparably more important. A book in ethics would blow up all other books (a remark quoted by McGuinness from Wittgenstein's lecture on ethics).

McGuinness reminds us of Wittgenstein's insistence that the style is the man, indeed the essence of the man (p. 264). I shall permit myself a comment on his own style, a style familiar to readers of his excellent biography of the young Wittgenstein. Here, as there, is a rich sense of occasion and context, achieved in part by numerous and effortless references into a very broad cultural background. The writing is marked by an unhurriedness that is very refreshing in view of a certain kind of breathlessness in much contemporary philosophical writing.

I must say that McGuinness is probably wrong to claim that "The chief novelty of the New Wittgensteinians  . . . is that they, in opposition to more traditional philosophical and literary critics, propose a theory for how Wittgenstein (of all people!) should be read." Perhaps some contributors to The New Wittgenstein can be said to propose such a theory, but it looks overblown to say this of all contributors to that collection (again discounting Hacker).

This collection is a worthwhile addition to the voluminous studies in Wittgenstein's early philosophy. Zalabardo is to be thanked for having assembled these high-quality and stimulating essays.