Wittgenstein's Form of Life

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David Kishik, Wittgenstein's Form of Life, Continuum, 2008, 146pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062239.

Reviewed by Newton Garver, University at Buffalo


Towards the end of Part II of the Investigations (p. 226) Wittgenstein writes, "What has to be accepted, the given, is -- one could say -- forms of life." There are two ways in which this passage fits with other uses of the expression "form of life" in Wittgenstein's work: first, it is preceded by remarks about mathematics and followed by remarks about color, and therefore occurs in the context of remarks about types of discourse that contain indubitable or necessary statements, about which Wittgenstein puzzled time and again. Second, it is utterly obscure what he means by a "form of life."

On the other hand there are four ways in which this passage is unusual:

·     It is the only passage in the Investigations in which the expression occurs in the plural.

·     It is the only time the expression is italicized.

·     It is the only time when there is an alternative expression -- "facts of living" (Tatsachen des Lebens) -- provided in Wittgenstein's notebooks (published in Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, vol. 1, §630).

·     It associates forms of life with the "given" (das gegebene), an unusual expression in Wittgenstein's work.

The "given" in Latin is datum, plural data, and the history of modern philosophy is strewn with different conceptions of the data with which we begin building the scaffolding of our understanding. For Descartes it is simple ideas, for Hume it is impressions, for Locke it is ideas, and for Kant sensations. Russell, with whose work Wittgenstein was thoroughly familiar, was notorious for changing his conception of the nature of our data, although he held firmly to the view that they were some sort of simples. In his Tractatus Wittgenstein seems committed to simples, but leaves us uncertain whether the simples are facts, which make up the world, or objects, which make up the substance of the world. Objects are not facts, and therefore, according to the opening sentences of the Tractatus, they are not part of the world. Yet Wittgenstein leaves us puzzling over whether we begin with facts and analyze them to find objects, or begin with objects and combine them to build facts. Whether or not this obscurity was one of the serious faults Wittgenstein later attributed to the Tractatus, it seems reason enough for his readers to be troubled.

The common characteristic of the given (data) in modern philosophy is that, however understood, what is given forms the foundation for understanding, allows for the analysis of complex thoughts and ideas, and provides the place where analysis ends. Complexities can be resolved into simples, and the ultimate simples are the given. It is this common characteristic that is overturned and rejected by Wittgenstein's association of the given with forms of life. Analysis is out. Clarity remains Wittgenstein's goal, but it cannot be achieved by analysis if what we begin with are forms of life.

Form, as Kishik notes, is explicitly associated with possibility in Wittgenstein's early work, and the association cannot be entirely discarded. Possibilities cannot be the elements of analysis. Analysis, as in chemistry, requires that the elements be definite well-defined simples. That is why associating the given with forms of any kind means abandoning analysis. One of the most remarkable features of Wittgenstein's later work is that his continuing search for clarity -- clarity as an end in itself -- eschews analysis, which nearly everyone else (including his younger self) sees as the key to clarification.

Kishik reviews for his readers all the occasions on which Wittgenstein speaks of form of life. His mastery of the texts is impressive, and extends to a smattering of the secondary literature, as well as to some of Wittgenstein's literary sources, such as Goethe and Tolstoy. His confident citing of texts from different, sometimes surprising, sources is a major strength of Kishik's work. In this context it is a bit disconcerting that he refers (p. 2) to Wittgenstein's MS 103 as a "letter," bowdlerizes his quotation of PI §23 (p. 87) in order to disguise a fallacious inference, and cites LC 53 as LC 58 (p. 103).

Kishik models the first part of the book on the Tractatus, even though his title calls attention to a much later idea. So the introduction is titled "World," the first chapter "Form," the second chapter "Picture," the third "Meaning," and the fourth "Philosophy." The next two chapter have titles taken from Wittgenstein's later work, "Grammar" and "Certainty." There is finally an epilogue, "Threshold," which heralds a sequel planned by Kishik and appears remote from anything of Wittgenstein's.

In the introduction Kishik's "World" is not composed of either facts or objects. He moves back to Spinoza for perspective, using Spinoza's characterization of substance as "Deus sive Natura" to suggest that from a unified Wittgensteinian perspective the world is perhaps Natura sive Vita. Since "to imagine a language is to imagine a form of life" (PI §19), and "language also has elective affinities with life" (p. 8), he suggests finally transforming this into "Lingua sive Vita." A creative reading of Wittgenstein indeed.

In the first chapter Kishik notes the importance of form in the Tractatus, and the distinction between proper concepts (such as yellow and square) and formal concepts (such as color and shape). He claims -- again creatively -- that life is a formal concept in the Tractarian sense, and that there is in this way a powerful continuity from the early to the later work of Wittgenstein.

I have no idea whether life ought in general to be regarded as a formal concept or not, but it is surely misleading to do so in the context of elucidating Wittgenstein's later philosophy. In the Tractatus the distinction between proper concepts and formal concepts helps Wittgenstein make allowance for propositions that are senseless (they lack T-F poles) but not nonsense, truisms such as "7 is a number, not a color." In the later work they are often called grammatical propositions, and their nature famously puzzled G. E. Moore. In the Investigations, however, it is clear that grammatical propositions are identified by their use, not by the nature of their constituents (PI §23, 656), and that the very same proposition may sometimes be used empirically and sometimes grammatically (PI §79). It is only in Analytic Philosophy, where the nature of a proposition is determined by the nature of its constituents, that the distinction between proper and formal concepts has a role to play. Noting the variety of language-games eliminates that role. So Kishik's main move in his first chapter obscures Wittgenstein's radical rejection of Analytic Philosophy.

In none of the following chapters does Kishik wrestle with Wittgenstein's texts or present a sustained argument. The second chapter ("Picture") begins with ethics and ends with hope, citing Goethe along the way. The next chapter ("Meaning") mentions the "dogma" of "meaning as use," citing PI §43, but gives only one (Gebrauch) of the five German words translated as "use" in the English version, thus overlooking the subtlety of Wittgenstein's discussions. The fourth chapter touches none of the critical issues I mentioned at the outset of this review.

In the fifth chapter Kishik assumes a strong dependence of "grammar" on "rules," contending (p. 87) even that "the rules of language must be, somehow, embedded in our very lives." It is utterly obscure what this might mean, reminding us that Kishik certainly does not share Wittgenstein's concern for clarity. Kishik seems unaware of Moore's wrenching uncertainty over what Wittgenstein meant by "grammar," and he makes no effort to relate his use of the word to either the ordinary use or to Wittgenstein's use. As for "rules," he shows no awareness that Anscombe was doubtful that there are any rules of language, on the ground that for the presumed "rules" of language there is no genuine contrast between following and disobeying them. Anscombe's insight is right about the facts, but others of us -- beginning perhaps with Rawls -- have instead suggested a rather Kantian distinction between regulative and constitutive rules, where the former restrict pre-existing possibilities (through duties or prohibitions) and the latter create new possibilities (as the rules of chess make castling possible). It is absurd to think of the rules of chess or of language as consisting of duties and/or prohibitions. None of these matters is hinted at in chapter five, nor does one find Kant, Anscombe, or Rawls in the bibliography.

Chapter six stresses Wittgenstein's association of certainty with animality, and hence with natural history, but neglects traditional philosophical matters. In On Certainty Wittgenstein makes the provocative remark, "'Knowledge' and 'certainty' belong to different categories" (OC §308). Nearly all philosophers since Descartes have thought that they belong to the same category (language-game), namely epistemology. Ignoring this powerful insight, Kishik's chapter ends with Moses, steering us toward religion rather than clarity. Alas!

The epilogue gives a brief and thoroughly inadequate summary of what scholars have said about Wittgenstein's use of the expression "form of life." Impressed by Max Black's discussion from decades ago, he concludes (rightly, I think) that the concept of form of life explains nothing. But he then goes on to say (p. 123) that it "is itself in need of explanation." This is curious, since he has summarized the fruitlessness of other attempts at explanation; and puzzling, since he gives no indication what an "explanation" might look like. The remark also leads us directly and decisively away from Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein has said that forms of life are given, and what is given is not something to be explained but rather something that just has to be accepted. Further, Kishik leads us directly away from Wittgenstein to Giorgio Agamben, for whom the notion of form of life "must become the guiding concept and unitary center of the oncoming politics" and "must constitute the subject of the coming philosophy" (p. 127). Such comments might be included in Wittgenstein's famous collection of nonsense. They are utterly alien to anything he ever wrote or thought.

In spite of its sometimes apt and erudite citation of Wittgenstein's texts, and its inclusion in the prestigious Continuum Studies in British Philosophy, Kishik's volume will be of little value to students of Wittgenstein.