Wittgenstein's Metaphilosophy

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Paul Horwich, Wittgenstein's Metaphilosophy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 225pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199661121.

Reviewed by Arthur W. Collins, CUNY Graduate Center


There has been a decline of interest in Wittgenstein in recent times. Graduate students and their teachers don't know as much about him as their predecessors did a few decades ago. That's too bad. In this climate, Paul Horwich's Wittgenstein's Metaphilosophy is welcome. Horwich deeply admires Wittgenstein. He understands Wittgenstein. His book is a statement of Wittgenstein's rejection of theory construction in philosophy. Horwich also presents a significant defense of that stance. The book deserves a wide audience. At the same time, it will be obvious to readers of Horwich that his reconstruction is not in close touch with what makes Wittgenstein such an important philosopher.

The core of Horwich's book is the presentation of an eight-stage program for the identification, origin, and elimination of philosophical pseudo-problems. This much is already heavy-handed for an expositor of Wittgenstein. The stages are: (1) recognition of the prevalence of "scientistic" expectations in philosophy; (2) making explicit philosopher's reliance on linguistic analogies; and/or, (3), reliance on overgeneralizations; (4) exposing the role of recognition of idiosyncratic features of philosophical subject matters leading to; (5) insoluble puzzles and paradoxes engendered by 1-4; creating, (6) perennial bewilderment; (7) scientistic theorizing presented in efforts to accommodate confused conceptions while escaping bewilderment; and, finally, (8) dissolution of the "problem" via therapeutic philosophical analysis. "Theory," for Horwich's account of Wittgenstein's rejection of it in philosophy, is essentially the introduction of explanations by means of a pattern of hypothesis and confirmation or disconfirmation that is the great foundation for success in the empirical sciences.

With an odd and (I take it) conscious allusion to the Tractatus, Horwich offers "the general form of a philosophical issue" which is also the general form of a pseudo-problem. Thus, it appears, following Horwich, that the elimination of philosophical pseudo-problems is the key to Wittgenstein's metaphilosophy. If this is correct, the end of philosophical theories will follow automatically when we no longer have anything to theorize about. Horwich does not mention this inevitable closing down of philosophy.

Horwich gives brief sample applications of the eight-stage program to familiar problems of number, time, truth, and good; and he gives a fuller presentation of the scheme in application to the concept of consciousness in his last chapter. This is explicitly offered as a mere sketch and it is sketchy. There are no flagrant errors or falsehoods in all this. In the details of argumentation Horwich is sharp. His central discussion is reminiscent of Wittgenstein, but, as exposition of Wittgenstein's ideas, it is flatfooted. Worse, there is nothing really like any of this is to be found in Wittgenstein's writing.

Horwich might be better thought to merely use Wittgenstein as a suggestive springboard for the presentation of his own conception of the pitfalls to which philosophical thinking is vulnerable and the means for avoiding them. But this is obviously not his intention. He wants to furnish a clear, simple, straightforward representation of doctrines that are difficult to follow and only partially addressed in many scattered suggestive passages in Wittgenstein's now extensive published writings. In those writings the view of metaphilosophy is far from clear, simple, and straightforward. Horwich is inspired by passages that propose the dissolution of traditional endlessly puzzling philosophical problems -- for example, the therapy of the famous fly-bottle passage. He proposes that philosophers don't and can't resolve philosophical questions having the "general form of a philosophical issue." They can delete those pseudo-problems. If we agree that, when all is said and done, this is Wittgenstein's conception, then we can understand why he is losing his earlier following. Isn't this a sign of partial success? Complete success would just put a stop to the wasteful babble altogether and professional philosophers would be candidates for retraining.

This is not a sound reaction to Wittgenstein. Few readers come away with this eliminativist conception although they do enjoy the fly-bottle and like discussions, and they may not know how to put the dissolution of pseudo-problems into an overall picture of Wittgenstein's philosophy and metaphilosophy.

Of course, Horwich's text does not read as if he finds his eight-step problem-elimination formula when he reads Wittgenstein. He offers a somewhat apologetic explanation of the relation of his schema and illustrations of its application to what Wittgenstein actually says. Horwich says his illustrative identification and dissolution of pseudo-problems "may well be along the right lines" for solving the problems and "They are offered as illustrations of what I take to be his conception of how the most characteristic problems in philosophy emerge, and of how they should, and should not, be handled" (60).

Horwich's formulations are strong in their own terms. Nonetheless, the dissolution of pseudo-problems is overdone. The fly-philosopher suffers from the illusion of confinement and, when the illusion is dispelled, he is not freed, since he has been free all along. He no longer bumps his head pointlessly against the glass or against the limits of language. The problem is gone and those philosopher-flies who insist on continuing to butt the glass will be understood to investigate questions that do not arise.

Like any other fan I enjoy this fly-in-a-bottle image. It is valid if it is itself not over-generalized. It says what happens to some philosophical problems according to some passages. It is not presented by Wittgenstein as the overall story for philosophy. Wittgenstein does not think that philosophy is an activity that always has the same formulaic structure, or that philosophy might close up shop one day. We should bear in mind that, the fly-bottle boast notwithstanding, Wittgenstein returns again and again to the same philosophical problems providing ever-new comparisons, examples, and insights. For instance, he had a life-long desire to deliver us from the idea of inner mental processes or entities that we can describe and report and that are somehow constitutive of our perceptual experience, sensation, remembering, believing, meaning, understanding, intending, and so on; constitutive, that is, of our conscious mental life. His work is full of brilliant passages that offer help in this project, but no completion of it is suggested. He did his brilliant and profound best. No one has matched his success. He did not think he had done anything like enough, and he was right.

Wittgenstein apologetically calls the Philosophical Investigations an album. He may have meant this, partly, as a comparison with an imagined better organized work, a treatise, with stated goals and sections marking their consecutive achievement. His work published after his death does not seem to move in that direction. Even Philosophical Investigations itself does not press for dissoluble pseudo-problems. Nonetheless, an imagined advance beyond the album format of the Investigations could be in the direction of Horwich's reconstruction of Wittgenstein.

On the whole, Wittgenstein's work is empirical without leading in the direction of empirical science. Well, how can that be right? It is right because Wittgenstein only draws attention to things that we already know. He intends to confine his "discoveries" to matters that will be recognized upon simple reflection. Everyone will agree.

Perhaps Horwich's best discussion is in the chapter on meaning and, more specifically on the idea that meaning is use. He explains that this slogan does not lead us to a Wittgensteinian theory about meaning, which it has been thought to do. Horwich makes it clear that Wittgenstein asserts that meaning is use as something that should be and will be conceded as obvious in the contexts of the examples he gives. Wittgenstein never argues at all for this contention but, instead, simply points out that we teach someone, a child, say, the meaning of a word by showing how to use that word; that we grasp what someone means by an expression when we understand how they are using that expression.

The inadequacy of pseudo-problem deletion for an account of the proper nature of philosophy is brought out clearly in rich discussions of meaning and rules that fill much of Philosophical Investigations. The message offered there is that we will have to use philosophical imagination and creativity to deal with words and expressions one at a time. Not every word will need investigation but it is also clear that there is no end to this work and no sense of pseudo-problems duly eliminated.

In my opinion, the least satisfying part of Horwich's work is his chapter on Saul Kripke's Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Horwich clearly realizes that Kripke's effort, whatever its merits as philosophy, is worse than his own as an interpretation of Wittgenstein. So, from the outset, Horwich explains that he includes attention to Kripke's book as interesting in itself and as an "alternative" of some sort to Wittgenstein's thinking, although it doesn't really present any Wittgensteinian stance. Thus, Kripke's ideas are irrelevant to the eight-step procedure. Horwich says

Kripke has devised a sceptical line of argument that is very different from the purely therapeutic preoccupation [of Wittgenstein] . . . [My] appraisal . . . will . . . reveal the substantial extent to which Kripke's Wittgenstein diverges from Wittgenstein himself. (144)

In fact, most of the discussion here is rebuttal of Kripkean claims and rather little comparison with Wittgenstein. I should say that the main point to be made, therapeutic goals aside, is that Wittgenstein does not think there is any paradox requiring a straight solution or any other solution. Kripke bases his book on Philosophical Investigations §201 "This was our paradox," which he takes to be the entry point for weird skepticism about meaning and rule-following that he thinks he shares with Wittgenstein. Curiously, Wittgenstein's rejection of the thought that we face any such paradox is expressed, in one place among others, in the rest of §201. Wittgenstein says that the idea that there is a paradox is a "misunderstanding" since what we actually arrive at is the appreciation

that there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation, but which, from case to case of application, is exhibited in what we call "following the rule" and "going against it." (trans. Anscombe, Hacker, and Schulte; Wiley Blackwell, 2009.)

This little passage is characteristic of how non-theoretical philosophy is to proceed. I introduce this detail not merely to emphasize the defect of Kripke's reading of Wittgenstein, but also to bring out the shortfall in Horwich's development of his eight-step procedure as if it sketches, however roughly, the gist and fundamental goal of Wittgensteinian metaphilosophy.