Wittgenstein's Private Language: Grammar, Nonsense, and Imagination in Philosophical Investigations, ##243-315

Placeholder book cover

Stephen Mulhall, Wittgenstein's Private Language: Grammar, Nonsense, and Imagination in Philosophical Investigations, ##243-315, Oxford, 2007, 148pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199208549.

Reviewed by Charles Crittenden, California State University, Northridge


Mulhall's primary concern is to examine ##243-315 of Philosophical Investigations, which center around the possibility of a private language, in the light of a distinction between the substantial and the resolute readings of the Tractatus.  The former of these readings takes the remarks at the end, though describing the propositions constituting the Tractatus as nonsensical, as suggesting that there are ineffable truths to which these propositions point -- truths that can never be stated as they lie beyond the limitations of language.  The resolute interpretation, on the other hand, understands these passages as saying that the limits of language really are the limits of sense and nothing ineffable or mystical lies beyond them.  Mulhall's aim is to show that the Investigations should be read in this latter, resolute, way -- as bringing out the limits of language so as to indicate that these are not just limitations on our abilities to understand but limits to the understanding itself.

A substantial reading is always tempting, says Mulhall, but would reflect a misunderstanding of Wittgenstein's intentions; accordingly, examining these crucial sections in the light of this distinction can elucidate the kinds of mistake that can generate this wrong interpretation.  Thus Mulhall's primary preoccupation is "that of critically evaluating the philosophical illumination that might be gained by attempting to transfer this originally Tractarian distinction between resolute and substantial readings to the context of Wittgenstein's later philosophy"(12).  Since Stanley Cavell's work on these sections has been sensitive to substantial/resolute issues, a second of Mulhall's goals is a critical evaluation of his discussions.  Third is to show that these sections are continuous with the earlier parts of the Investigations in their employment of figuration, imagery, and metaphor, a focus of Mulhall's previous work.  While his procedure is to examine consecutively what he considers to be the most important of these sections, his analysis is made more complex with these changing emphases -- now on understanding Wittgenstein's meaning, now on Cavell's commentary, and less frequently excursions into the work of figures such as Heidegger, Nietzsche, Emerson, Kafka, and Iris Murdoch.  I cannot address everything that Mulhall's rich and sometimes idiosyncratic commentary includes but will confine myself primarily to the first of his goals. 

In #243 Wittgenstein ostensibly describes a language where the words refer to someone's inner, private experiences, which therefore can be understood only by the person himself and not by anyone else.   The substantial interpretation takes it that such words are supposed to have a definite application; yet, as the sections following #243 show, the description of the situation in which they are to apply rules out their having any application at all.  The resolute approach finds this too quick: language is flexible and offers many uses.  Instead of indicating the meaning of the words used in presenting the private linguist's conception, the philosophical therapist must follow out the many senses for the crucial terms here that language may provide.  When this process is exhausted and no meaning is found to satisfy this linguist, then she will find this procedure convincing and realize that there is no sense at all to the private language idea.  She will not suppose that it still suggests some possibility that we could think if only the rules of language would allow it. 

Both these interpretations lead to the same result -- the deconstruction of a philosophical proposal.  What then is the difference?  If the proponent of a philosophical idea really believes that the words setting out the proposal "articulate an insight, then simply to oppose them or dismiss them (by directly invoking a grammatical articulation that they appear to violate)" would fail to acknowledge that the proposer will "necessarily respond from within her conviction".  She will feel "that her point must have been misunderstood, or that she has discovered something that undermines her, and our, prior investment in that article of grammar".  So treatment of the suggestion must "articulate the [proponent's] fantasy from the inside, and thus to participate in what is latently nonsensical with a view to allowing its nonsensicality to become patent"(82-83). 

Mulhall gives here a striking and effective expression of Wittgenstein's intentions.  But this makes it clear that the philosophical theorist (skeptic, solipsist, private language advocate, et al) is employing a philosophical conception -- an intellectual construction having implications for understanding a certain range of phenomena and consistent or conflicting with other such constructions, etc.  Classically such conceptions have been accepted or rejected on the strength of supporting or opposing arguments.  Wittgenstein's approach is to deal with the meaning of the terms in which they are phrased.  But unlike logical positivism, which imposes the external meaning-standards of empirical science, his procedure is to show that such conceptions violate the very rules of the language in which they are expressed.

At this point, what one misses in Mulhall's discussion is a concentrated examination of Wittgenstein's account of the kinds of philosophical thinking he opposes and his treatment of it.  Sections #89 to roughly #115 are important in this regard; here Wittgenstein introduces the notion of a picture and speaks of its role in traditional philosophical thought. #89 speaks of our desire "to explore the nature of all things" -- not from an interest in empirical facts or causal connections "but from an urge to understand the basis, or essence, of everything empirical".  Yet "'The essence is hidden from us': this is the form our problem now assumes"(#92).  We come to think of something as the underlying essence in a particular case because of the words used to describe phenomena: "a simile that has been absorbed into the forms of our language produces a false appearance, and this disquiets us.  'But this isn't how it is!' -- we say. 'Yet this is how it has to be'"(#112).  "A picture held us captive.  It lay in our language and language seemed to repeat to us inexorably."(#115)  The origins of essentialistic thinking lie in pictures embedded in forms of speech.  A picture functions as a conception of an underlying state of affairs; it can therefore never come into conflict with observable facts and so cannot be falsified or modified by appeal to them.  Undermining its hold requires working through the expressions seeming to suggest it and coming to realize that they do not support it, as Mulhall has pointed out.  This is a conceptual process, one of noticing meaning and logical consequences.[1]

Yet Mulhall, following Cavell, sees such philosophical proposals as having a psychological origin.  Skepticism about other minds, for example, is an expression of a feeling of powerlessness with respect to others, a general sense of not understanding or being able to communicate with them.  This powerlessness "presents itself as ignorance -- a metaphysical finitude as an intellectual lack"(85, quoting Cavell).  The articulation of this lack requires using language in a secondary way, one not licensed by the primary use but still not comprehensible without a grasp of it (e.g. calculating in the head is understandable only to someone who understands calculating out loud or on paper (Phil. Inv. p. 216)).  The attempt to express this sense of powerlessness results in uses of language that are strictly unintelligible but that indicate to the skeptic that her experience is felt by the philosopher -- a private language.  This acknowledgment of the skeptic's experience is an essential part of the process of philosophical therapy. 

Yet this seems wrong-headed: it ignores the conceptual nature of essentialistic proposals and so would seem to have no place for the purely grammatical procedures Wittgenstein uses.  These constitute an appeal to reason rather than an attempt to deal psychologically with the effects of a troubling personal experience.  What role would the conceptual processes Mulhall has pointed out -- recalling uses of terms central to the expression of the skeptic's picture -- have in the treatment of the feeling Mulhall sees as behind philosophical skepticism?  Nevertheless his discussion of substantial vs. resolute interpretations remains valuable; however, it must be taken as addressing the logical origins of a philosophical conception rather than the genesis and effects of an uncomfortable personal experience.  This holds also for his remarks on #255 concerning philosophical vis-a-vis medical or psychoanalytic therapy.  Seeing philosophical problems and their treatment as grammatical rather than psychological makes it less appropriate, in comparing the philosopher's question to psychological states treated by the psychoanalyst, to suggest that it may be relevant to consider "the individual, spiritual costs of struggling to fit into a routinized everyday realm; … the extent to which ordinary adulthood is not only constructed out of, but is also inherently pervaded by, impulses, drives, and fantasies that resist control, sublimation, and repression" (92).  Such considerations seem remote from the pictures that "lay in our language" and the conceptual reminders that Wittgenstein conceived as central to eliminating confusions based on them.

Mulhall's comments on further sections are frequently illuminating, and imaginatively extend the discussion.  Thus his remarks on the private diarist in #258, who is trying to set up a private definition for a name referring to a sensation, are helpful; he is right in pointing out that the section is not self-contained but requires #257 and #260 to make clear the point being made here -- that naming has a place in language as a whole and cannot be severed from it.  On the other hand, Mulhall's concern with Cavell sometimes leads to discussions not helpful for those chiefly wanting insight into Wittgenstein, for example on whether Cavell accords these passages resolute or substantial treatment.  And sometimes Mulhall's remarks seem quite idiosyncratic -- as when he finds in Cavell's meditations on Emerson's 'Self-Reliance' the expression of "a wish for the connection between my claims of knowledge [i.e. those of Emerson's private diarist whose thoughts Cavell is expressing] and the objects upon which the claims are to fall to occur without my intervention, apart from my agreements"(109).  Even if Cavell is right about Emerson's essay, it is not clear how this kind of psychological speculation furthers our understanding of a philosophical problem.

Mulhall's comments on #268 begin a series of intriguing discussions that bring to a head the issue of the sense in which in these sections Wittgenstein is giving a relatively clear-cut argument against the possibility of a private language.  Mulhall points out that as Wittgenstein allows the private linguist to develop his case, we see this linguist "repeatedly inclined to displace words from their familiar public context into a personal one which lacks their familiar accompaniments"(117).  These secondary uses are meaningful only against a background of public discourse, with all its familiar practices and assumptions.  This point carries over into Mulhall's last chapter, on the beetle-in-the-box fantasy of #293.  One way of reading Wittgenstein's remarks is to take them as presenting a transcendental argument, suggests Mulhall: the distinction between successful and unsuccessful reference can be drawn only in the public realm, since only there can the presence or absence of the object named be checked by others.  A condition for a term's being a genuine name is, therefore, access to the public realm (133-4).  This argument rules out the possibility of a private language, as it points out that the private language conception cuts out everything counting as public expressions of sensations and so eliminates any basis for allowing the distinction of real from failed reference to be made. 

But Mulhall seems to reject this argument: it is hard to avoid thinking that we know what it would be like for reference to occur in a case where it fails.  So we inevitably "experience the transcendental condition we take ourselves to have unearthed as a limitation rather than as a limit"(134).  Yet one can respond that rightly understood, the argument does point out a limit -- it is senseless to imagine reference in circumstances where there is no way of telling when the ostensible referent is present.  What seems to describe a possible situation merely presents a picture, a form of words that borrows the surface grammar of names and reference from their use in public contexts but that eliminates in the privacy situation the background conditions that make their employment possible.  Indeed, this is the conclusion Mulhall arrives at in presenting his alternative and favored reading of these passages -- as a reductio intending to bring out the emptiness of the apparently meaningful proposal that there can be reference to purely private entities.  Without public objects of comparison we cannot know what such names refer to or even whether they refer to anything at all; the initial supposition of a private language is empty (136-7). 

But it is very natural to think that these two interpretations identify different components of the same overall contention: the transcendental deduction states a broad limit of thought but requires a principle that generalizes the results of the reductio.  This generalization arises immediately from the reductio and thereby becomes available for the more direct and comprehensive conclusion that the argument expresses.  These two types of procedure combine to provide a powerful objection against the possibility of a private language.

We can take Wittgenstein's reflections in these passages, then, as supporting the idea that there are general requirements for language.  And this leads to a final comment on Mulhall's many-layered, stimulating, and often illuminating book: some commentators[2] have recently emphasized Wittgenstein's late attention to themes concerning broad aspects of thought, e.g. in "very general facts of nature" (Phil. Inv. p. 230), the stability of nature (On Certainty #473), or the limits of doubt (On Certainty #477).  Here Wittgenstein's interests have developed beyond the therapy central to Philosophical Investigations and concern comprehensive features of our overall conceptual scheme.  Perhaps Mulhall's discussions make it easy to see how this transition was a natural one for Wittgenstein to make.


[1]            For elaboration see my 'Wittgenstein on Philosophical Therapy and Understanding', International Philosophical Quarterly (Vol. X, No. 1), pp. 20 - 43.

[2]            See e. g. Daniele Moyal-Sharrock, ed., The Third Wittgenstein: The Post-Investigations Works (Ashgate, 2004); Rush Rhees (ed. By D. Z. Phillips), Wittgenstein's On Certainty (Blackwell, 2003); and Avrum Stroll, Wittgenstein (One World, 2002).