Wittgenstein's Tractatus: A Dialectical Interpretation

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Ostrow, Matthew B., Wittgenstein's Tractatus: A Dialectical Interpretation, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 175pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-00649-X.

Reviewed by Christopher Pincock, Purdue University


This study of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus [TLP] builds on and, in several important respects, goes beyond recent, controversial reinterpretations of the early Wittgenstein by Cora Diamond and Juliet Floyd. The most welcome innovation that Ostrow offers is a careful consideration of the details of the text itself, including Wittgenstein’s discussion of states of affairs, facts, pictures, logical analysis and the essence of the proposition. These discussions allow Ostrow to clarify one way in which we can take seriously Wittgenstein’s remark towards the end of the Tractatus that “My propositions serve as elucidations in the following way: anyone who understands me eventually recognizes them as nonsensical, when he has used them – as steps – to climb up beyond them” (TLP 6.54). Despite his considerable innovations, however, I believe that much more work is needed to show that Ostrow’s interpretation is correct.

Ostrow’s “Introduction” helpfully situates his interpretation of the Tractatus in the range of major interpretations offered to date. On the one side are the more traditional interpretations of the Tractatus given by writers such as Pears, Anscombe and Hacker. They all attempt to downplay the significance or the scope of the book’s peculiar conclusion. According to Ostrow, Pears interprets Wittgenstein as offering a philosophical account of the world, language and logic, and so Pears must completely dismiss 6.54 as a mistake or misguided. Others, such as Anscombe, take 6.54’s use of the term “nonsense” in a peculiar way. “Nonsense” indicates only that what is communicated in the book goes beyond what can be said, where “said” is understood in terms of the previously developed theory of saying and showing. While such an approach can accommodate 6.54, it still faces the challenge of articulating exactly how this kind of nonsense can communicate something that cannot be straightforwardly said.

Ostrow rejects both of these interpretative strategies and sides with the more radical proposals of Cora Diamond. Beginning with her paper “Throwing Away the Ladder”, Diamond argued that 6.54 requires that we take all of the Tractatus leading up to 6.54 to be “just so much gibberish” (p. 5).1 The burden on this proposal is, of course, to explain why someone would spend so much time writing and publishing something that was complete nonsense. Diamond, and other interpreters such as Floyd and Conant, have argued that the Tractatus has a “therapeutic intent” (p. 7) to bring the reader to see the hopelessness of traditional philosophy and its problems. These readings do have the salutary effect of downplaying the divisions between the early and later Wittgenstein, but to date have yet to present a fully satisfying picture of how straightforward nonsense can be philosophically therapeutic.

Ostrow can be seen as taking the next step along the road set by Diamond as he claims, paradoxically, that “a sentence like “’The world is everything that is the case’ is nonsense” is itself nonsense” (p. 10). Thus, his interpretation is a ‘dialectical’ interpretation because he reads Wittgenstein as taking up a host of philosophical terms, and showing for each of them how what appeared to be a clearly understood term was in fact nonsensical. There are no significant exceptions to this critical project, though, and so terms like “nonsense” themselves are eventually criticized. The point of all this for Ostrow is to liberate the reader from philosophy by vigorously engaging in a range of philosophical projects and showing that they are futile. He reads the Tractatus, then, in a way that many of us have learned to read Wittgenstein’s later Philosophical Investigations. In both texts, at each point a philosophical position or problem is shown to be based on confusion or error.

Ostrow’s book is divided into four chapters, where his interpretation is supported by considering some of the major topics of the book. Chapter I, “Pictures and logical atomism”, focuses on the metaphysics of objects, states of affairs and facts that Wittgenstein presents in the opening sections of the Tractatus, and some parts of the explanation of picturing. Chapter II, “What is analysis?”, considers Wittgenstein’s account of logical analysis, e.g. when a proposition is analyzed into its logical components. Chapter III, “The essence of the proposition”, concerns the general form of the proposition and the connection to Wittgenstein’s explanation of logical inference. Finally, chapter IV, “The liberating word”, summarizes the aim of the book in light of the previous chapters’ investigations. Ostrow argues for a fundamentally ethical aim for the Tractatus by connecting philosophy with an alienation from the world: “If, for the Tractatus, philosophy comes to stand for our fundamental estrangement from the world, it is then in the disappearance of philosophy that our redemption lies” (p. 133).

A summary of chapter II will hopefully convey the flavor of Ostrow’s general approach. Wittgenstein says

In a proposition a thought can be expressed in such a way that elements of the propositional sign correspond to the objects of the thought.
I call such elements ‘simple signs’, and such a proposition ‘completely analysed’.
The simple signs employed in a proposition are called names.
A name means an object. The object is its meaning. (‘A’ is the same sign as ‘A’.)
The configuration in a situation corresponds to the configuration of simple signs in the propositional sign. (TLP 3.2-3.21)

No propositions of ordinary language are completely analyzed in this sense, and this has led many commentators to see Wittgenstein as making a substantial philosophical claim here about the possibility of either constructing a logically perfect language or carrying out a complete analysis of the propositions of ordinary language. Ostrow argues for a quite different purpose in these remarks through a consideration of the ordinary claim “The watch is lying on the table”. An analysis of this proposition would initially lead to an existentially quantified statement:

if the watch in the above example could be completely characterized in terms of a description of the color (C) and shape (S) of its parts, then the analysis of the proposition asserting that the watch is lying on the table – assuming the phrase “lying on the table” (L) could be understood as indicating a form – would begin with an existentially quantified statement of the form: “∃x (Cx & Sx & Lx).” (p. 56)

This, in turn, would yield a series of propositions for each of the possibilities compatible with the truth of the original claim.

Such an understanding of logical analysis is only the first step for Ostrow. For a complete analysis must terminate in names, and a reflection on what names are and how they are exposed in analysis greatly complicates the whole project. Here Wittgenstein’s version of Frege’s context principle is crucial, as it shows us that names are signs that appear in a whole collection of propositions: “We understand a meaning only when we look at how the propositional sign functions within a whole class of propositions” (p. 62). And, this in turn leads us to see that a complete analysis will involve rewriting a proposition in terms of various coordinate systems where names as traditionally understood designate a place within these systems. The systems themselves make naming possible, but they cannot themselves be named. For example, in the watch case “The forms of color and spatial position are thus absorbed into my method of representation; they become part of the means by which I can describe the world rather than further elements that themselves have linguistic representatives” (p. 68).

This leads Ostrow to see in “The sign determines a logical form only together with its logical-syntactical application” (TLP 3.327) an invocation to focus primarily on the use of propositional signs by individuals. The correct analysis of a proposition depends on the use that we put it to. Here, though, we do not have a traditional philosophical claim about language, but rather only an attempt “to make evident the nature of the logico-philosophical inquiry itself” (p. 70). For in getting us to realize that logical analysis is dependent on our use of language, and not on any deep metaphysical facts about the world, Wittgenstein is seen to be undermining the kind of logico-metaphysical investigations associated with Frege’s rigid division between concepts and objects or with Russell’s elaborate theory of types. Both of these approaches are rejected by Wittgenstein because they fail to take seriously the problematic character of philosophical investigation itself. Instead, for Wittgenstein,

what begins as an attempt to specify the necessary features of the world ends with the recognition that these extend as far as our language itself, that the “specification” can be no more than an acknowledgement that we speak, sometimes with sense, sometimes nonsensically (p. 72).

The project of logical analysis is itself undermined and with it the whole cadre of philosophical terms such as “object”, “fact”, “complex” and “number” that go along with it.

In several instances, then, what appear to be straightforward philosophical claims about the world, language or logic are argued to be rather invitations to reflect on traditional philosophical claims and projects. In each case Ostrow finds in the text the materials to show how these philosophical projects are frustrated. He is thus able to handle not only 6.54, but also Wittgenstein’s programmatic remarks about philosophy such as “Philosophy is not a body of doctrine but an activity” (4.112). By working through several key stages of the text, and by extending the scope of what is nonsensical to ascriptions of nonsense themselves, Ostrow has made an important contribution to the interpretative line occupied by Diamond, Floyd and Conant.

Despite these advantages, Ostrow’s book suffers from several flaws. To begin with a minor one, the book will be all but incomprehensible to someone who has not worked through the Tractatus and several commentaries. Ostrow often launches into intricate rereadings of key passages of the text without discussing the context in which these passages appear. While alternative interpretations of the Tractatus are discussed in the introduction, in the text itself there is little or no argumentation against other interpretations. Ostrow’s book, then, is certainly not suitable as an introduction to the Tractatus, and will be of use only to specialists in the Tractatus.

A narrow intended audience alone is not a serious flaw, though. What is more unsettling are the frequent interpretative leaps that Ostrow makes in his discussion. For example, it is quite difficult to accept both that 3.327 is an invitation to focus on our use of language and that Wittgenstein made this recommendation to get us to reflect on philosophy itself. Wittgenstein’s solipsism seems to preclude any serious concern with our use of language, and there is little evidence in the text that this remark is meant to have any kind of metaphilosophical purpose. Rather, Wittgenstein seems to be making a technical distinction between a sign and a symbol and noting that we can only determine which sign is which symbol if we include how it is used to represent to world.

This leads me to Ostrow’s admittedly frank confession to have given “short shrift to the Tractatus’ discussions of number, probability, scientific theory, the propositional attitudes and solipsism” (p. 16). These topics are crucial because they are discussed in the 5s and 6s that lead up to 6.54, the lynchpin of Ostrow’s entire interpretation. It is a remarkable consequence of Ostrow’s interpretation that mathematics, scientific laws and philosophy are all nonsense. Given Wittgenstein’s longstanding interest in the philosophy of mathematics and science, it simply defies belief that claims such as

The propositions of mathematics are equations, and therefore pseudo-propositions (TLP 6.2)
If there were a law of causality, it might be put in the following way: There are laws of nature.
But of course that cannot be said: it makes itself manifest. (TLP 6.36)

have no meaningful philosophical content.2 These are the most difficult parts of the Tractatus for Ostrow to handle, and until he does so his interpretation cannot be accepted.

An alternative interpretation of the Tractatus might take seriously the various roles that Wittgenstein attributes to mathematical, ethical, psychological and law-like claims. While each of these types of claims falls short of saying anything in the restricted sense of “saying” described in the Tractatus, they all have some genuine use. Furthermore, Wittgenstein appears to present philosophy as the activity of separating out the different kinds of uses of language when he says, “Philosophy aims at the logical clarification of thoughts” (TLP 4.112).3

This point highlights a more fundamental difficulty with Ostrow’s methodology, and this difficulty extends, I believe, also to the work of Diamond, Floyd and Conant. In attempting to link 6.54 with the later Wittgenstein’s supposedly anti-philosophical methodology, they have given up any attempt to take the Tractatus’ own historical context seriously. The views of Wittgenstein’s contemporaries besides Frege and Russell are scarcely mentioned and the possible sources of Wittgenstein’s own views are never explored. Rather, we are given an investigation of a disembodied text. I fear that until we situate the Tractatus better in its own time and place, we will make little progress in reconstructing its intended content.


1. See Cora Diamond, The Realistic Spirit, MIT Press, 1991.

2. See Mathieu Marion, Wittgenstein, Finitism, and the Foundations of Mathematics, Clarendon Press, 1998 for a discussion of Wittgenstein's philosophy of mathematics.

3. This approach was suggested in Hans Sluga's lectures on Wittgenstein in the fall of 2001.