Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction

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Alfred Nordmann, Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 234pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521616387.

Reviewed by Jinho Kang, Seoul National University


"[A]nyone who understands me eventually recognizes [the statements in the Tractatus] as nonsensical, when he has used them -- as steps -- to climb up beyond them," wrote Wittgenstein in the penultimate passage of the Tractatus (6.54)[1]. This paradoxical remark has baffled readers of the Tractatus ever since the book came out, but it has not become a serious subject of discussion until Cora Diamond's controversial paper, "Throwing Away the Ladder," was published in 1988.[2] Diamond argues in it that we will completely miss Wittgenstein's anti-theoretical and therapeutic view of philosophy already apparent in the Tractatus unless we take seriously his remark that its statements are really, literally nonsensical. While Diamond's "resolute" reading[3] has many attractive features, it also invites a host of questions, including how seemingly intelligible statements of the Tractatus could be nonsensical and why Wittgenstein bothered to write (and we should bother to read) a book consisting of nonsense. Commentators sympathetic to Diamond's reading have tried to develop answers to these questions, while those critical of it have tried to argue that none of them works. And the debate still goes on.

Alfred Nordmann's Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction shows how much scholarly discussions of the Tractatus have been changed by this debate. Traditional readers might expect that an introductory book on the Tractatus would be organized around the following topics: Frege's and Russell's logical theories as the main background; the ontology of logical atomism; the "picture theory" of language; the theory of logical statements as tautologies; the Tractarian views on knowledge, mind, solipsism, mathematics, science, ethics, and the "mystical". Though Nordmann does address some of these topics, especially the picture theory, his central concern is to answer a single question which he formulates as follows: how would it be possible to show that "the Tractatus is written in a nonsensical language and [that] it advances a persuasive argument"? (p.8; italics original). Let us call this the "Main Question" for future reference. Nordmann's book is divided into five chapters, and each of them comprises a step toward his answer to the Main Question. I wonder how many Wittgenstein scholars, including "resolute" readers, will be comfortable with the idea of organizing an introduction to the Tractatus around the topic of its nonsensicality; I certainly have reservations. But whether or not it is appropriate for an introductory book, it will surely be a great contribution to our understanding of the Tractatus if Nordmann has succeeded in finding a satisfactory answer to the Main Question. Though Nordmann proposes novel and stimulating ideas throughout the book, my overall judgment is that he has not succeeded.

In Chapter 1 of the book, Nordmann sets the stage for the subsequent discussion by situating the Tractatus in the tradition of "critical philosophy," the tradition which he characterizes as an attempt to find "a middle ground between dogmatism and skepticism" by examining "human language or reason to determine its implicit presuppositions, its capacities, its limits." (p.14) Nordmann singles out Immanuel Kant, Georg Lichtenberg, and Heinrich Hertz as three ancestors of critical philosophy who exerted most influence on the early Wittgenstein, and discusses affinities between their thoughts and Wittgenstein's in the Tractatus. Nordmann makes a fairly plausible case here, and his discussion of the little explored affinities between Lichtenberg and Wittgenstein is particularly interesting. But there seems to be a crucial difference between Kant, Lichtenberg, and Hertz on the one hand, and Wittgenstein on the other, a difference that has a direct bearing on the Main Question: Wittgenstein's way of drawing the limits of language and thought in the Tractatus seems to be a lot more radical than those thinkers'. For example, Kant famously draws the limits of human reason by arguing that we cannot know anything about what lies beyond our experience, but he still allows that we can at least think about it. There seems to be no analogue to this knowledge/thought distinction in the Tractarian limits of language and thought, as Wittgenstein maintains that "what lies on the other side of the limit will simply be nonsense" (Preface, p.3). Hence one way of domesticating the paradoxical remark in 6.54 seems to be blocked, namely that Tractarian statements can still be thought even if they are nonsensical in the sense that they cannot be known.

Now, it turns out that Nordmann does think that the Tractatus contains something analogous to Kant's knowledge/thought distinction. But we have to wait until the second half of Chapter 4 and Chapter 5 in order to see what this distinction is and how he argues for it. In Chapter 2 through the first half of Chapter 4, Nordmann instead takes further preliminary steps for his answer to the Main Question, this time by tackling the Tractatus directly. Chapter 2 develops and defends the thesis that the Tractatus has an "overarching argument" and that it has the form of a reductio ad absurdum. Nordmann claims that this argument has the following main hypothesis:

(OA) We are able to express any sense whatsoever in our two-dimensional script, that is, nothing is inexpressible in speech and all sense is in the world and within the limits of language.

A corollary follows from (OA), which is that

(OB) Statements such as (OA) are not nonsensical.

According to Nordmann, however, Wittgenstein draws from (OA) and (OB) the following conclusion, which can be found in 6.522 of the Tractatus:

(C) There is the inexpressible in speech.

Nordmann argues that (C) is established on the basis of the picture theory of language. In the picture theory, genuine sentences have their expressive capacities in virtue of the logical forms they share with the states of affairs they represent. But all states of affairs have the feature of contingency in that they can either obtain or not obtain. Hence genuine sentences cannot represent what is not contingent, which includes, according to Wittgenstein, matters regarding the essential nature of logic, language, the world, and values. These matters are inexpressible; hence (C). Now we can see that (C) contradicts (OA), and also (OB) because (C) implies that statements such as (OA) are indeed nonsensical. Furthermore, we have to conclude that the statements in the Tractatus are nonsensical given that they talk precisely about the essential nature of logic, language, the world, and values. The Tractatus is unique in that it ends up denying the very hypotheses it has put forward.

One may ask several questions here, including whether the Tractatus really has an overarching argument and whether it has the form of reductio. But I will not pursue them, as I have a more basic question. When one denies the premise in a reductio-argument, what one denies is only its truth, not its significance: if the premise of the reductio-argument is not even significant, it will not be able to play its role as a premise. But the radical conclusion of Wittgenstein's reductio-argument seems to deny the very significance of its premise with the implication that it is nonsensical. Nordmann himself is well aware of this problem, conceding that "what we need to understand is how … Wittgenstein's sentences are nonsensical without being utterly self-defeating, nonsensical and instructive or elucidatory" (p.79).

The radical nature of Wittgenstein's conclusion raises the same kind of problem for Nordmann's discussion in Chapter 3, where he investigates the literary character common to the statements of the Tractatus and suggests that they can usefully be thought of as aphorisms. Drawing upon the works of Gerhard Neumann, Franz Mautner, and J.P. Stern, Nordmann characterizes aphorisms as personal records of the ideas having actually occurred to the author that nevertheless claim to be impersonal and objective. This conflict between personal and impersonal characters of aphorisms, Nordmann argues, provokes the readers to engage in and articulate the thought experiments behind the author's ideas recorded in the aphorisms. Concerning the Tractatus, in particular, Nordmann suggests that each of its statement as an aphorism is a miniaturized thought experiment that is intended to challenge the readers to go through the process of Wittgenstein's global thought experiment in the overarching reductio-argument, whose ultimate aim is to make the readers realize that each Tractarian statement is nonsensical. This is an interesting idea, but if it is to be plausible, we need to know more about how Tractarian statements could be aphorisms in the way Nordmann characterizes if they are simply nonsense.

Again, the same kind of problem arises for Nordmann's discussion in the first half of Chapter 4. In this part Nordmann investigates the grammatical character of Tractarian statements and boldly suggests that they should be understood as implicit subjunctives. According to him, for example, the famous opening remark of the Tractatus, "The world is all that is the case," should really be understood as follows:

If any sense whatsoever were expressible in speech and I wanted to express thoughts about the relation of language and the world, it would first occur to me that the world is all that is the case. (p.138)

With this characterization of Tractarian statements as subjunctives, Nordmann attempts to give a unified treatment of his discussions in Chapter 2 and 3. According to him, both the overarching reductio-argument of the Tractatus and its individual aphoristic statements share a purely hypothetical character and accordingly can be written best in the subjunctive mood. This is again an interesting idea, but we need to know more about how Tractarian statements could play the role of hypotheses in the subjunctive mood if they are simply nonsense.

In sum, what is urgently needed for Nordmann is to show that the supposed nonsensicality of Tractarian statements does not prevent them from playing the roles he assigns in Chapter 2 through the first half of Chapter 4. Nordmann begins to address this task in the second half of Chapter 4, and his main proposal is unexpected and surprising. It is well known that the Tractatus classifies sentences into three categories: sentences that have senses (=sentences of natural sciences), sentences that are senseless but not nonsensical (=tautologies and contradictions), and nonsensical sentences (=philosophical and metaphysical statements). Now Nordmann's proposal is that there is another category of sentences, namely those that are nonsensical but not senseless, and that the statements in the Tractatus belong precisely to this category. This is why Tractarian statements can be employed to draw the limits of language and thought, why they can play the role of premises in the reductio-argument, and why they can be aphoristic hypotheses in the subjective mood that prompt the readers to go through Wittgenstein's thought experiments.

What does Nordmann mean by "nonsensical but not senseless"? According to him, a sentence is nonsensical in the Tractatus if it is not logically grammatical, if it violates "logical syntax," while it is senseless if it does not have a truth-condition. So it seems as if Nordmann meant that the statements in the Tractatus violate logical syntax but still have truth-conditions. But it turns out that this is not what Nordmann means, as he also argues that Tractarian statements as subjunctives do not have truth-conditions: according to his interpretation, the picture theory has a consequence that only a sentence in present tense and the indicative mood can have a truth-condition. What Nordmann really means by Tractarian statements being "nonsensical but not senseless" is that they are not senseless in another sense of "senselessness," corresponding to another sense of "sense" in the Tractatus. According to Nordmann, this second, "wider" conception of sense roughly corresponds to the conception of meaningfulness or point, as when we talk about the "sense of this action" or the "sense of my life." Let us call this conception "sense*" and the corresponding conception of senselessness "senselessness*," respectively. Then we can understand Nordmann's proposal as saying that Tractarian statements are nonsensical (=violate logical syntax), senseless (=lack truth-conditions), but not senseless* (=not pointless). If so, however, Nordmann's classification of sentences into the above four categories is confusing, as it naturally leads the readers to suppose that he is talking about the same conception of senselessness when he suggests that tautologies and contradictions are senseless but not nonsensical while Tractarian sentences are nonsensical but not senseless.

But this confusion will be relatively unimportant if Nordmann is right that Tractarian statements have senses* although they lack senses. Do we have reasons to think so? This is the question Nordmann addresses in Chapter 5. The relevant discussions in this chapter are the most important for Nordmann's purpose, but unfortunately they are also the most problematic. Nordmann concedes that Wittgenstein in the Tractatus is silent about whether its statements have senses*. Accordingly he appeals to Wittgenstein's remarks in other writings, including those in the later period, as supporting textual evidence. I doubt that this is a legitimate interpretive strategy. Moreover, I do not find the discussions convincing. Nordmann claims that Tractarian statements as aphorisms and subjunctives are comparable to gestures, performances, and music in that the latter can convey points that are beyond linguistic meanings. Nordmann attempts to defend this claim with his exegeses on Wittgenstein's scattered remarks about gestures, performances, and music in the early and later period. As far as I can see, however, there is no indication in these remarks that Tractarian statements have senses*, let alone the indication that they have senses* in the way gestures, performances, and music convey non-linguistic points.

Still, let us suppose with Nordmann that Tractarian statements have senses* in the sense that gestures, performances, and music convey non-linguistic points. Can this provide a satisfactory answer to the Main Question? I do not think so. By definition, a sentence that has only sense* can be neither true nor false, just as gestures, performances, and music can be neither true nor false. But recall that Nordmann's Main Question was how it would be possible to show that Tractarian statements are nonsensical but still advance a persuasive argument. Unless Nordmann means something entirely different by the term "argument" here, the relevant argument must consist of statements that can have truth-values so that it can guarantee the truth of its conclusion if its premises are all true. But how could Tractarian statements yield an argument, whether it is a reductio or a straightforward one, if they have only senses* and thus can be neither true nor false? Nordmann admits that the premises and conclusion of the Tractarian reductio-argument cannot have truth-values, but still maintains that it is a legitimate argument (pp.197-9). I confess I do not understand what he means here.

In relation to this problem, I should mention the difficulty raised by the picture theory in Nordmann's answer to the Main Question. As we have seen, the picture theory plays a crucial role in Nordmann's reconstruction of Wittgenstein's two arguments, the first being the overarching reductio-argument and the second being that Tractarian statements as subjunctives do not have truth-conditions. For these arguments to work, then, we must suppose that the picture theory is true, or more correctly speaking that the statements that comprise the picture theory are true. But how could this be for Nordmann, given that those statements are a part of Tractarian statements which supposedly cannot have truth-values?

In sum, Nordmann is in a dilemma: either he must admit that the Tractatus does not contain any argument, in which case he will not be able to answer the Main Question, or he must admit that Tractarian statements can have truth-values, in which case he will not be able to show that they are nonsensical. I do not see how Nordmann could get out of this dilemma.

Before I finish this review, let me just add a few words about the difficulty of writing an introduction to the Tractatus. I expressed earlier my reservations about Nordmann's choice of organizing the introductory book on the Tractatus around the topic of its nonsensicality. On the other hand, however, I can certainly understand his motivation. Whether Tractarian statements are really nonsensical as Wittgenstein urges is undoubtedly the most fundamental question of the Tractatus, for it affects our understanding of every statement in the text. As I have indicated in the beginning, however, commentators are sharply divided about what the proper answer is. Given this situation, it seems to me still premature to expect an introduction to the Tractatus comparable to an introduction, say, to Plato's Republic, Descartes' Meditations, or Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. We have rough agreements about what the authors are up to in these philosophical classics. Concerning the Tractatus, however, we do not have any such agreement, at least not yet.

[1] References to the main body of the Tractatus are associated by numbers with the cited passages; references to the Preface are by page numbers. I follow Pears and McGuinness' translation of the Tractatus.

[2] Cora Diamond, "Throwing Away the Ladder," Philosophy 63 (1988): 5-27; reprinted in her The Realistic Spirit (MIT Press, 1991), pp.179-204.

[3] The term "resolute reading" had been originally suggested by Thomas Ricketts.