Wittgenstein's Tractatus: History and Interpretation

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Peter Sullivan and Michael Potter (eds.), Wittgenstein's Tractatus: History and Interpretation, Oxford University Press, 2013, 273pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199665785.

Reviewed by Andrew Lugg, University of Ottawa


Wittgenstein's declaration at the end of the Tractatus that his Sätze are nonsensical has commanded much -- some would say too much -- attention in recent years. But it is now time and possible, the editors of this collection note, to move beyond quarrelling over whether Wittgenstein 'resolutely' believed his remarks unsinnig or 'irresolutely' thought he could package important philosophical truths in the form of nonsensical propositions. Taking the controversy over how the Tractatus should be read to have exceeded its 'shelf-life', Sullivan and Potter reckon 'polemical advocacy' can be ditched in favour of 'more constructive' engagement with 'the book that stands before the moment when the ladder is thrown away' (2).

In the opening essay Michael Potter summarises what is known about the pre-Tractatus writings, notes how the all-too-spotty evidence has been understood, criticises earlier interpretations of the material and lays out his own understanding of Wittgenstein's route to the Tractatus. In particular, Potter argues that a fair amount of the pre-1916 manuscript material has been lost and speculates on how 'the 1916 Tractatus' became the Prototractatus (there are small errors in the summary table on page 37, notably MS 103 is NB3, not NB4). If not the last word on the subject, Potter provides enough for most of us to go on with, at least pending a still richer account.

Next comes Hanne Appelqvist on the 'dilemma' of how ethics can have a point if, as Wittgenstein holds in the Tractatus, 'there is no value in the world' (40). Taking the key to lie in Wittgenstein's claim that 'Ethics and aesthetics are one' (6.421), she adopts an 'interpretative approach . . . that emphasises the continuity of a philosophical tradition from Kant to Wittgenstein' (40) and compares Wittgenstein and Kant regarding 'disinterestedness', 'subjective purposiveness', 'subjective universality' and 'the ethical "ought"' (46-57). Such 'similarities' (46) are worth pondering, but I fear the question of how Wittgenstein dispatches the dilemma was largely, if not entirely, lost in the shuffle. No doubt part of the problem is that Kant's remarks on judgements of taste are far from perspicuous, and the evidence for taking Wittgenstein to have been influenced by them is -- as Appelqvist more or less allows (46) -- is pretty thin.

The following essay, described by the editors, as '[a] less structural and perhaps more romantic perspective on Wittgenstein's ethics' (4), treats the Tractatus as significantly influenced by Kierkegaard (59). Like Appelqvist, Genia Schönbaumsfeld begins with some 'historical background'. She argues that while 'there are no direct references to Kierkegaard [in the pre-1918 manuscripts]' (62), Wittgenstein was aware of his writings. Perhaps, but how likely is it that Wittgenstein was inspired by Kierkegaard, his concern with the limits of the expression of thoughts notwithstanding? Spotting remarks of Wittgenstein reminiscent of remarks of Kierkegaard is one thing; concluding that their remarks mean the same, another. Nor could I bring myself to read the two final propositions of the Tractatus as a 'moral injunction' to the effect that 'it is a sin not to hold one's tongue' (73).

With Ian Proops on Frege's influence on the Tractatus, we are back on more familiar ground. To test the widely held view that Wittgenstein's thinking about the inexpressibility of category differences (e.g. between object and concept) is traceable to Frege, Proops zeroes in on the 'concept horse problem', 'a natural starting point for any discussion of Frege's views on logical category distinctions' (76). He carefully explores four ways of understanding the problem and concludes there is 'scant reason to suppose that Wittgenstein would have derived his views on the inexpressible from Frege' (94). This is nicely argued and useful for understanding Wittgenstein's thinking. It is only unfortunate that Proops does not explain why 'the view that [Wittgenstein] merely arrived at these views by reflecting on issues to which Frege's work gives rise . . . is plausibly correct' (76), but just states that 'it is . . . perfectly possible that reflection on certain remarks in Frege's writings . . . would have led him to [his] ideas' (94).

In his remarks on logical constants in the Tractatus, Peter Milne applauds that Wittgenstein's 'Grundgedanke' are 'not representatives' (4.0312) but deprecates his conception of them as 'punctuation marks' (5.4611). He observes that while it looks 'very much as though Wittgenstein will end up with a quite untenable account of the logical constants' (100), there is a way of saving what he says (107-110), one that he is plausibly regarded as having embraced (111). Still, Milne believes Wittgenstein is misleading, if not 'plain wrong', about how signs for logical constants contribute to the sense of sentences (123). This is fine provided 5.41 can be read as condensing Milne's argument for the Grundgedanke (111) and there is no reviving the standard reading of 5.4611 as stating that the signs for logical constants are no more proxies than punctuation marks. Also, I ask myself, how clear is it that the Grundgedanke itself, which came early, was backed by a 'proof' (112)?

Thomas Ricketts's contribution deserves special consideration, not least because he takes on the commonly voiced complaint that the treatment of logic in the Tractatus is unacceptably limited. The gist of his argument is that the first of the three ways of forming expressions mentioned at 5.501 covers sentence logic; the second way predicate logic; and the third way higher-order logic. Ricketts does not claim outright that Wittgenstein has this in mind, but just says he would like to think he did (138), and in the absence of a better reading of the text I should like to think so too. I only hesitate because Wittgenstein explains simpler ideas at length, and it is puzzling why he did not write more on such an interesting line of thought. But even if Wittgenstein was chancing his arm, Ricketts persuades me that the conception of logic in the Tractatus is not as clumsy as the augurs would have it.

The burden of William Child's study is that Cora Diamond wrongly maintains that Russell's commitment to a language possessed by a single person is targeted in the Tractatus. This is not the first time Diamond's argument has been criticised -- it has, for instance, been pointed out that it falters at the first hurdle since Russell treats sense data as public objects (144, footnote). But rather than tilling this old furrow, Child concentrates on Diamond's tendency to read Wittgenstein's later views back into the Tractatus and contrasts her reading of Wittgenstein's early thinking with his 1929 treatment of sensation language. These points surely deserve an airing whether or not another refutation of Diamond -- even one supplemented by a discussion of 'The Tractatus and Dummettian realism' -- advances our understanding of Wittgenstein's thinking.

Just a small part of James Levine's lengthy paper on 'Logic and solipsism' is on the Tractatus, the rest being devoted to 'Berkeley's master argument and Prior's analysis', 'Russell on solipsism' and 'Davidson and Nagel'. Those primarily concerned with understanding Wittgenstein will find the section on 'The early Wittgenstein on solipsism' of most interest, especially the subsection on 'Solipsism and showing', which can be read on its own. I doubt, however, I shall be alone in feeling Levine could have spent more time on the remarks surrounding 5.62, spelt out his own interpretation in greater detail and explained why his interpretation of the text is preferable to simpler, more traditional interpretations.

The final two essays concern the question of whether Wittgenstein was at the time of the Tractatus a transcendental idealist. A. W. Moore (for) and Peter Sullivan (against) take there to be remarks in the book that could have been penned by a transcendental idealist but differ on whether Wittgenstein should be regarded as speaking in such remarks as 'in propria persona' or 'as if in scare quotes' (248, cf. 256). The nub of their debate -- it is on-going -- is, as they both concede, hard to discern, and I found myself wondering whether transcendental idealism is as plainly in evidence in the Tractatus as they believe. Moore winds up describing Wittgenstein as a transcendental idealist in the sense that 'he held the propositions of logic to be true [and] objects to be simple' (254), but why think this commits Wittgenstein to idealism, transcendental or otherwise?

Reviewing the volume as a whole I could not help but notice how few pages are devoted to the history and interpretation of the Tractatus. As often as not, Wittgenstein's remarks serve as pretexts for general philosophical discussions and textual explication rapidly gives way to philosophical speculation. His discussion is construed in present-day (or other alien) terms even though it is now widely deemed a mistake to construe it in terms of his own earlier and later writings. Only infrequently is the text itself at centre stage and the Tractatus wars left firmly behind, a doubly unfortunate fact since Wittgenstein's aims are clearest when his words are most fully in view. At such moments it is apparent -- whatever Wittgenstein says about his own propositions -- that he is out to express thoughts, indeed thoughts the truth of which are, as he says in his Preface, 'unassailable and definitive'.