Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus

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Roger M. White, Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, Continuum, 2006, 163pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826486189.

Reviewed by Fraser MacBride, Birkbeck, University of London


Roger White's book on the Tractatus is an exemplary work. It succeeds in introducing the novice to the logical and metaphysical doctrines needed to navigate the archipelago of epigrams that constitute the Tractatus. It also succeeds in advancing our understanding of those doctrines. One is left with a profound impression of the Janus-faced features of the Tractatus, features that enabled Russell and Ramsey to make sense of the Tractatus as a work of discursive genius but eventually led Wittgenstein to recognise that what he had written was nonsense.

White's book (hereafter WTLP) appears in a series of Reader's Guides. Whilst it is written in such a way that it can be read independently of the Tractatus, WTLP admirably fulfils its role of providing a guide to the detail of the latter work that encourages the student to move back and forth between commentary and key passages in the text. WTLP invites favourable comparison with Anthony Kenny's astute and respected Wittgenstein (Penguin, 1973), although White and Kenny differ with regard to the interpretation of a number of important arguments in the Tractatus. However, because WTLP, in contrast to Kenny's book, concentrates solely on the Tractatus, it is able to furnish the reader with a far more thorough-going appreciation of the structure of that work, a vivid understanding of what the Tractatus in its succeeding sections is for. The penultimate section of WTLP also includes a judicious assessment of the recent controversy between those who favour a traditional interpretation of the Tractatus and the proponents of the 'new Wittgenstein'.

However, WTLP does not only exhibit these admirable pedagogical features. It also contains important new interpretations of Wittgenstein's argument(s) for logical atoms, the beguiling but bewildering arguments of 2.0201-2.0211 and 3.23-3.24, interpretations that significantly extend our understanding of the Tractatus. Before outlining White's interpretations of these particular Tractarian arguments it will be worthwhile to convey an impression of the structure of WTLP itself and the insights into the Tractatus it affords.

The overarching theme of WTLP is to make sense of the declared aim of the Tractatus "to set a limit to thought, or rather -- not to thought, but to the expression of thoughts" (Author's Preface, WTLP: 3).[1] What does it mean to draw a "limit" and why would one want to draw one? It was common ground between Russell and Wittgenstein that Russell's paradox resulted from our transgressing the limits of what may legitimately be thought or said. Russell attempted to provide a resolution of the paradox by establishing a new, scientific way of talking, a perfect language governed by the theory of types, whose strictures on what could legitimately be said would exert a constraining rational influence upon us, preventing our transgressing those limits and straying into paradox and nonsense. But the difficulty with the theory of types is that any attempt to state it violates the theory's own type restrictions. So Russell's attempt to state the limits of language and thought is self-defeating because the theory of types he employs is, by its own lights, nonsense. Wittgenstein therefore proposed an alternative way of drawing a limit to what could legitimately be thought or said. His idea was if we understand the way our ordinary language already works, its implicit logical syntax, then Russell's paradox would already have been dealt with from within, from the resources already given to us. How so? Because, as White puts the point, "a complete account of the logical syntax would set the limits of language, not by stating what those limits were, but simply because the offending sentences would never be generated" (WTLP: 10, see also 24, 119).

To provide a complete account of logical syntax that enables us to appreciate the limits of thought and language Wittgenstein sets himself the extraordinary -- really jaw-dropping -- programme of establishing "the general form of the proposition", the form that captures what is common to every possible proposition. As White explains it, "the general form of a proposition would show the limits of language since it would establish a systematic way of generating every possible proposition, and what could not be so generated would be thereby shown to be nonsense" (WTLP: 11). White breaks this programme down into three stages: first to discover the nature of the proposition; second, to demonstrate that there is such a beast as the general form of a proposition; third, to carry out the technical task of specifying what that form is. The ensuing commentary of WTLP is designed to illuminate in detail the different ways in which the different sections of the Tractatus contribute to the execution of this programme.

White begins his commentary with an extended and careful examination of sections 1-4 of the Tractatus where Wittgenstein is primarily concerned with the first stage of this programme, endeavouring to establish the nature of propositions (WTLP: 22-83). White starts from the simplest of the principles that guide Wittgenstein's thinking about propositions, that a proposition is essentially what is true or false. What does it mean for a proposition to be true or false, the right or the wrong thing to say? It is for a proposition to be answerable to something that sets the standard for rightness and wrongness. So White's Wittgenstein introduces the world as the totality of facts because this is the sum total of what sets the standard of rightness and wrongness for the propositions of our language to meet. This makes the task of the initial sections of the Tractatus one of answering the question: "What is the nature of the relation of the propositions of our language to the world, so that they are true or false according to the way the world is?" (WTLP: 23). The answer, toward which White patiently guides us, is that a proposition is a picture, or a model, of reality. A proposition is itself a fact and therefore capable of sharing a form, a logical multiplicity, with another fact. It is because facts share logical forms that propositions may be intelligibly treated as pictures, or models, of other facts.

The second stage of Wittgenstein's programme is to demonstrate that there is such a thing as the general form of a proposition. Wittgenstein provides an explicit argument for this at the close of section 4 of the Tractatus. To prepare us for this argument, White lays especial emphasis upon the role of compositionality in Wittgenstein's development of the picture theory (WTLP: 70-1, 82-3). A language is compositional if the meaning of a proposition is a function of the words it contains and the way they are put together. Appreciating the compositional structure of language enables us not only to explain our ability to understand novel propositions, as Frege and Davidson have insisted. It also enables us to make sense of a proposition independently of its being true. It is because we understand the meanings of the individual expressions that make up a proposition and the way they have been arranged that we are able to construct a picture, or a model, of the situation that has to obtain for the proposition to be true, even if it isn't. This can only be possible if a proposition derives its significance from its position within a compositional language system. This supplies Wittgenstein with grounds for affirming that there is such a thing as 'the general form of a proposition'. It is the general form of a compositional system of language, a system whose existence is proved by our capacity to understand novel propositions, regardless of whether they are true or false.

Having proved to his own satisfaction that there is such a thing as a general propositional form, Wittgenstein proceeds in section 5 of the Tractatus to the third stage of the programme White has outlined, sketching out the basic structure of the single system in which every proposition would be generated. Proposition 5 of the Tractatus says, "A proposition is a truth-function of elementary propositions". White sketches Wittgenstein's argument for this claim as emerging from the materials already assembled in the preceding sections. The world has been explained as the totality of facts, where facts are conceived as consisting in the existence or non-existence of states of affairs (combinations of objects). 'Elementary propositions' are introduced as the propositions that directly represent those states of affairs in such a way that there is a 1-1 correspondence between elementary propositions and the states of affairs they represent. It follows that settling the truth-value of every elementary proposition will settle exactly which states of affairs exist and which do not. White continues,

But we would then know everything that is the case, and thus have at our disposal all the information to settle the truth value of any significant proposition whatever: any apparent proposition whose truth value of the elementary propositions could not be answerable to the way the world was. But saying that is tantamount to saying that every proposition is a truth function of elementary propositions. (WTLP: 85-6)

In a tour de force of exposition White then explains how, according to Wittgenstein, every non-elementary proposition can be perspicuously generated from elementary propositions by a finite number of applications of a single truth-operator (WTLP: 86-100).

Wittgenstein begins section 6 of the Tractatus with a statement of the general form of the proposition by giving a variable whose values would include every significant proposition. He thereby completes the programme of implicitly defining the limits of language. For any apparent proposition that fails to be included amongst these values will thereby be exposed as nonsense. The remainder of section 6 is devoted to dismissing, in one way or another, a range of what appear to be counter-examples to drawing the limits of sense where 6 says it is, where the successive application of truth-functional operations to elementary propositions gives out. Not least amongst this range -- that includes logical, mathematical, scientific and ethical claims -- are the statements of the Tractatus itself; they appear to be significant but it defies comprehension to conceive of such claims as merely truth-functional combinations of elementary propositions. White initially focuses on what Wittgenstein says in section 6 about logical truth and the consequences of endorsing his conception of the general form of the proposition for metaphysical enquiry more generally (WTLP: 101-114). But this is preparatory for the culminating discussion of White's book that finally, fully reveals to us the Tractatus' heart of darkness.

In the Tractatus Wittgenstein seeks to avoid paradox by drawing a limit to language. He does so by giving an account of the general form of the proposition according to which paradoxical sentences cannot even be constructed. But, as White lays out very clearly, Wittgenstein's own solution is "every bit as paradoxical as the original paradoxes: once we have realised that, by the same token, [his] solution cannot itself be stated". For Wittgenstein's own account of the general form of the proposition is not a truth-functional combination of elementary propositions. And, as White continues to reflect,

the paradox is clearly exacerbated by the fact that Wittgenstein seems to have been saying precisely what he is arguing cannot be said, and equally we seem to have been able to understand him, and argue for and against the positions he has apparently been putting forward. (WTLP: 119)

Wittgenstein himself draws the conclusion at the close of section 6 that anyone who understands him eventually recognises that what he has said is nonsense, so leading us to the sole statement of section 7 with which the Tractatus concludes, "What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence". White devotes the penultimate section of his book to canvassing some of the different options that have been put forward for interpreting these passages (WTLP: 118-34). His discussion is critical of the proponents of the 'new Wittgenstein', who favour the view that the Tractatus is just nonsense, the reading of it intended only by its author to perform a therapeutic role. Ultimately, White dismisses the view as a persuasive reconstruction of the Tractatus because he cannot see what therapeutic value to reading nonsense there can be: "After all, self-refuting metaphysical theories, even theories that turn out to be nonsense in their own terms, are hardly a rarity in the history of philosophy" (WTLP: 129). White favours instead a traditional interpretation of the Tractatus according to which Wittgenstein's text is intended to show us things that cannot be put into words, but are manifest in our use of language. What language does is state the facts. So whatever it is that is shown by the Tractatus, but not said, cannot be a fact. White suggests instead that it is a pattern within the facts, not an additional fact, that the Tractatus shows us. But, as White reflects, "the difficulty is thinking through what is meant by talking of such a pattern without making it an additional fact" (WTLP: 133-4).

Many of the interpretations that White develops will be familiar to Tractatus aficionados. But the point is not that these interpretations are new, but that they are done so well in an introductory guise. However White also offers novel interpretations of the Tractatus, key amongst these being his readings of Wittgenstein's arguments for the existence of logical atoms. There are two notorious passages in the Tractatus where Wittgenstein argues for such simples. In the first passage Wittgenstein assumes, for the sake of reductio, that there are no simples. But if there are no simples "then whether a proposition had sense would depend on whether another proposition was true" (2.0211). But, Wittgenstein continues, this would be absurd; complexity all the way down would compromise our capacity to "sketch any picture of the world (true or false)" (2.022). Since we can sketch (represent) the world in truth-evaluable ways, it follows that there must be simples. In the second passage Wittgenstein argues from the "requirement that sense be determinate" (3.23) to the requirement for simple signs that pick out simple objects (3.24). Commentators have struggled to offer convincing interpretations of these passages, often interweaving them, often assuming a commitment on Wittgenstein's part to a strong form of bivalence and to a denial of worldly vagueness. White, however, offers a strong case for the claim that these passages offer quite different arguments for simples that have nothing to do with bivalence or vagueness, a case that is backed up by evidence that White gathers from the earlier Notebooks (WTLP: 38-44, 53-60).

White interprets the first passage (2.0201-2.0211) as an argument for simples that ultimately flows from an underlying assumption Wittgenstein makes about representation:

Wittgenstein is insisting on a conception of pictures according to which it is an intrinsic property of a picture that it is a picture, and what it is a picture of. It must be possible to tell that a picture is a picture, and what it is a picture of, from the picture itself without reference to anything outside. (WTLP: 43)

(White also discerns this commitment emerging elsewhere in the Tractatus; WTLP: 69, 108, 143). This assumption turns out to be incompatible with the possibility of the world consisting solely of complex things. It is a feature of complex things that they are capable of fragmenting into their simpler constituents. So if there were only complex things for our words to pick out then it would remain an open possibility that our words were empty because the complex configurations they purported to name failed to exist. In order to assure ourselves that our utterances weren't empty, that they were endowed with "sense", we would therefore be required to independently investigate whether the complexes in questions existed, whether the propositions that said these complexes existed were indeed "true". But this compromises the assumption that it is "an intrinsic property of a picture that it pictures what it does" (WTLP: 43); it makes it an extrinsic matter whether what we have said succeeds in picturing reality at all, requiring us to investigate independently whether something is so, whether a certain complex exists. Wittgenstein therefore concludes that what we say must be analysable into propositions whose names are guaranteed a priori to be non-empty because they refer to simple, necessarily existing things -- propositions that we simply need to grasp in order to understand what state of affairs they picture.

White interprets the second passage (3.23-3.24) as an argument for simples that ultimately flows from an ontological assumption. White draws a distinction between 'vague' and 'unspecific' propositions: "we shall call a proposition 'vague' if there is no clear answer to the question whether it is true or false; we shall call it 'unspecific' if there is a wide range of ways in which it could be true" (WTLP: 55). Thus, for example, "Some of Schubert's late works are typical of early romanticism" is vague because there are no clear-cut criteria for appropriately describing something as early romantic. But it is also 'unspecific' because it does not specify which of Schubert's works are in question. According to White, Wittgenstein's "basic idea is that lack of specificity is a feature of our language, not of the world. The propositions that we utter are all more or less specific, but it makes no sense to talk of the situations in the world that actually make them true or false as lacking specificity" (WTLP: 56). White strives to give us some feeling for Wittgenstein's ontological intuition that the world itself is specific by considering the claim that inflation rose last month. This claim is unspecific (indeterminate) in the sense that it does not specify which financial transactions are responsible for making it true (which shirt was bought at which shop etc.). Nevertheless, we do not think it barely true. If it is true it is because of the specific (determinate) financial transactions that actually take place (because that shirt was bought at that shop etc.). So, if we are to understand how such a claim is capable of being responsive to the way that the world is, it must be possible to analyse the claim that inflation rose last month in such a way that what it says answers to specific states of the world. Wittgenstein's suggestion is that we do so by spelling out the sense of the proposition in terms of a vast disjunction of possible sets of particular financial transactions that suffice for the claim to be true.

Now, according to White's interpretation, claims about complex things are invariably unspecific. For example, "the claims we make about a watch will typically be compatible with a wide variety of detailed ways in which the watch has been assembled" (WTLP: 59); for example, when I say that my watch has stopped, there are many particular ways in which this may have come about, concerning particular cogs and wheels, but I do not specify which. To be responsive to the way the world is, propositions about complex things, like my watch, must be therefore analysable into disjunctions of specific propositions. But since claims about complex things are invariably unspecific it follows that the specific propositions into which they are analysed must consist solely of names for simple things.

This is merely an outline of the different interpretations White uses to distinguish Wittgenstein's arguments for simples. And, of course, there are many questions to be raised about the case White presents. Nevertheless, it should already be evident that in seeking to disentangle these arguments White succeeds in opening up important questions about the underlying conceptions of representation and ontology that shape them. Moreover, White does so in a way that makes evident to the novice what is interesting about reading the Tractatus for its own sake.[2]

[1] See L. Wittgenstein Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, trans. D.F. Pears & B.F. McGuiness (Routledge: London, 1961).

[2] Thanks to Nick Jones and Roger White.