Women and Citizenship

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Marilyn Friedman (ed.), Women and Citizenship, Oxford University Press, 2005, 240pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195175352.

Reviewed by Ann E. Cudd, University of Kansas


This book is a collection of essays presented at a conference on Women and Citizenship held at Washington University in St. Louis in April 2002. The contributors to the volume include several distinguished scholars, and represent diversity in both scholarly discipline and ethnic background. The essays take up themes surrounding the question of in what sense women's citizenship is devalued in law, civil society, or social or religious norms. The book is divided into three parts: Part I contains three essays that examine the meaning of citizenship under particular governments with their particular legal systems (two on the US and one on France); Part II contains four essays on the "practices of citizenship," including participation in community activism and international non-governmental organizations, the "border-crossing" practices of Chicanas, and the role of care work in the life of a citizen; Part III contains three essays about the "grounds" of citizenship, that is, the presuppositions for the ability to fully participate in the roles of citizenship. In this review I will discuss seven of these essays that most fully engage the philosophical issues of the female exclusion from citizenship, then raise an issue about a potential gap in an otherwise excellent book.

Iris Young's essay, "The Logic of Masculinist Protection: Reflections on the Current Security State," explores the masculinized notion of the state as protector in the context of the US political and military response to the 9-11 attacks. The logic of the protector is that of the Hobbesian bargain: give up rights in exchange for security; it can be seen at work in the Patriot Act and the flouting of international law by the Bush Administration with respect to captured suspected terrorists or combatants. Like the patriarchal father over "his" children and women, "the logic of masculinist protection works to elevate the protector to a position of superior authority and demote the rest of us to a position of grateful dependency." (25) It is not a good deal, however, not only because the world is arguably no safer, but more importantly it creates a subordinate citizenship that is incompatible with democracy. Although women are disproportionately the subordinate citizens, since fewer of them are in authority, men are also widely made into subordinate citizens. Young suggests (too briefly) that the protectionist logic should be replaced by a citizen defender logic. One wonders, though, whether even this logic contains a masculinist element that will undermine women's citizenship.

Historian Joan Scott's essay's title, "French Universalism in the Nineties," looks unpromising to the philosopher's eye, but richly rewards the philosophical reader. Scott explores the debates in the 1990's over the parité law, which sets quotas for women representatives at various levels of government. Through this debate she explicates the difference between the universalist French notion of citizenship, which abstracts from the differences between particular persons and expects each to reach for the general will, and the American notion of citizenship, in which citizens are expected to vote on the basis of their differing interests, given procedural limits on the power of factions. French society thus scorns the legal recognition of difference, or even its public display, while American society engages, if ambivalently, identity politics, affirmative action, and free public expression. How the paritairistes won the day in France, then, is puzzling. Immutable difference, even of sex, would seem to be no reason to override the universalist stance. Rather, the argument turns on the recognition of the sex/gender distinction, and the fact that, since getting the vote in 1944, women have not come to hold anywhere near their share of seats. Hence the social fact of gender is shown by the paritairistes not to have been abstracted away by French society, and thus it becomes incumbent on law to do so. However, the debate has recently turned away from this argument toward the claim that parité depends on an immutable sexual difference, a claim that the paritairistes abjure. Scott asks, then, whether the gender argument, valid though it may be, can withstand the rhetorical sophistry of a society with powerful voices bent on subordinating women.

The third essay of this first section (conceptually the richest of the three) is Sandra Bartky's "Battered Women, Intimidation, and the Law". She begins with an analysis of intimidation as "a threat of harm to come which, when successful, may also constitute a present psychological or physical violence; its paradigm cases involve some form of human agency, typically exercised by those who have superior power over us, real or fantasized." (54-5) Bartky then examines the way that the legal system, their birthright as citizens, intimidates women who attempt to use it to protect themselves from domestic violence, often causing them to renounce their claim and return to their abusers. This essay resonates with Young's essay as it reiterates the Hobbesian state-as-protector logic. In the end Bartky suggests that in failing to protect them, the state has returned such women to the state of nature with respect to the batterer, questioning whether women who kill their abusers can legitimately be subjected to criminal prosecution. This essay thus questions whether battered women are receiving their stake in the social contract.

The second and third parts of the book mainly contain essays that propose solutions and evaluate proposed solutions to the problems that constitute women's second-rate citizenship. Joan Tronto's "Care as the Work of Citizens: A Modest Proposal" proposes that carework be elevated to the status of work that defines citizens, much as soldiering, government service, civic participation, and even paid market work has been seen as the definitive markers of citizenship. She proposes this for two reasons: because we in the US (and other wealthier nations) have a crisis of care, in that there are not enough caregivers among the citizenry to fulfill our needs for care, and because those who have been the caregivers in society (women, and increasingly, women from abroad) are undervalued and suffer from low status. In principle the argument that caregiving is as essential to society as soldiering is clear, but this point has been recognized before without making a positive difference to women. It is important not to essentialize caregiving as female labor (and Tronto does not), and to guard against the same rhetorical pitfalls that Scott's essay documented for the parité movement.

Alison Jaggar's "Arenas of Citizenship: Civil Society, the State, and the Global Order" investigates the role of non-governmental organizations (NGOs) in empowering women through these internationally focused civic organizations rather than through governments. NGOs offer a way for persons to participate in global civil society over and above their roles as national citizens. While NGOs may seem like a good solution for feminist activism in the face of recalcitrant and sexist governments, Jaggar raises a number of cautionary notes about this route to empowering women. First, she notes that there is no natural innocence to civic organizations; they can be as corrupt, sexist, racist or otherwise mistaken as governments. Second, even when they are well intentioned, NGOs must raise funds and naturally this means that they must be accountable to the donors, who are often less progressive and feminist than the organization founders. Further, this often requires NGOs to be staffed by fundraisers, who are often quite removed from the problems, issues, and desires of the client women. Finally, the existence of the NGOs relieves the pressure on governments to provide services, yet civil society is hard pressed to completely meet the needs of governments. Thus NGOs must be monitored for their intentions, their performance, and their unintended consequences.

Martha Nussbaum's essay, "Women's Education: A Global Challenge," argues for greater investment in women's education, particularly where literacy rates are especially low for women, on the part of national governments and NGOs. She presents her well-known capabilities-approach argument, extending it to secondary and higher education for the sake of the development of women's critical and imaginative faculties. Nussbaum also echoes Jaggar's concerns, however, about monitoring the effects of NGOs.

Anthropologist Suad Joseph's excellent essay, "The Kin Contract and Citizenship in the Middle East," belongs perhaps in the first section, as it takes up the issue of the connection of the nature of the social contract for women citizens in Middle Eastern countries. Joseph introduces the notion of a "kin contract," which describes the ways in which persons in the Middle East construct rights and responsibilities through their relations to kin. Thus the kin contract mediates the citizen-state relation, in contrast with the western social contract, in which the state mediates family and civic relations. Because their citizenship is mediated through kinship, and males dominate females in kinship relations, men are privileged as citizens over women. Because of their characteristic patrilineal kinship relations, men can confer citizenship on wives and children, although women cannot confer citizenship on foreign-born husbands or children. Most consequentially, women are subordinated to men in family law, as daughters, wives, or mothers. Marital rape is not recognized, and honor crimes are treated as lesser crimes than the same treatment of non-kin citizens. In showing how "the kin contract is the critical means for constituting political patriarchy in most Middle Eastern states," (166) Joseph has refigured the social contract much as Pateman did for women and Charles Mills did for Blacks in western political thought.

This book provides a rich and nuanced analysis of many of the conceptual and material grounds of full citizenship. The analysis comes through an investigation of ways that a group, women, can fail to achieve full citizenship or the benefits thereof. While the book covers a wide range of such issues, one which receives less attention than perhaps merited is the issue of immigration. Two essays, those by Aída Hurtado and Joan Tronto, mention the issue, but do not focus on it. Tronto makes an interesting proposal to offer immigrant status in return for care work, much as becoming a soldier offers a route to US citizenship. The questions of how the borders are policed and the requirements that immigrants must meet to become citizens are crucially important in a world with such global inequities, particularly in how women fare in different societies. This issue could be usefully explored through the kind of gender lens trained on the concept of citizenship that is offered in this book.