Women and Liberty, 1600-1800: Philosophical Essays

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Jacqueline Broad and Karen Detlefsen (eds.), Women and Liberty, 1600-1800: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2018, 272pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198810261.

Reviewed by Nancy Kendrick, Wheaton College, Massachusetts


This excellent collection of essays on early modern women and liberty provides richly detailed analyses of freedom from both political and metaphysical perspectives. With one exception (Martina Reuter’s essay on François Poulain de la Barre), the essays treat the works of women writers.

Before turning to the individual essays, two points are in order about the collection taken as a whole. First, the editors are to be congratulated for including biographical details of the subjects of the volume in an appendix, rather than having these details included in the individual essays. Recovery work in the history of philosophy has been going on for several decades now, and the decision not to include biographical data about these philosophers at the start of the essays signals the expectation that it is the responsibility of the reader to know — or to find out — who these women are.1 Second, though the collection will surely prove useful for those scholars wishing to read selectively, a cover-to-cover read of the text forcefully conveys the full(er) details of a complex philosophical history of the ideas of liberty, autonomy, and volition and creates a well-deserved admiration for the early modern writers included in this volume who played a significant role in forging that history.

Karen Detlefsen opens Part I of the text — Ethical and Political Liberty — by considering the relation of feminism to liberty in the works of Mary Astell and Margaret Cavendish. Detlefsen argues that Astell and Cavendish can be considered feminists despite advancing some positions about women’s social roles that contemporary feminists would reject. She does this by identifying in Astell’s and Cavendish’s works three forms of liberty essential (yet largely denied) to the intellectual and moral development of 17th-century women: the freedom to cultivate one’s reason, the freedom to create an authentic self, and the freedom to create female-friendly communities. Detlefsen also argues briefly that literary works, such as plays and novels, can be important sources of philosophical insight and argument.

Next, Reuter examines three treatises by Poulain de la Barre, all of which address the liberty of women indirectly by focusing on its opposite: the subjugation of women. Reuter shows that Poulain relies on the Cartesian argument for the unity of the sciences to champion women’s unacknowledged intellectual capacities. The subjugation of women is so widespread and so ordinary, Poulain claims, that it is practically invisible. Reuter emphasizes Poulain’s insistence that women overcome the internalized cultural prejudices they have learned to accept about their own (and other women’s) supposed intellectual inferiority by developing their self-knowledge. This involves the Cartesian approach of examining opinions oneself rather than uncritically adopting the opinions of others.

In “Gabrielle Suchon’s ‘Neutralist’: The Status of Women and the Invention of Autonomy,” Lisa Shapiro provides an analysis of Suchon’s insistence that women need an alternative to the “professions” of either marriage or religious vocation in order to develop as full human beings. This alternative is the Neutral or celibate life. Suchon’s Neutral, Shapiro explains, is someone who chooses to create a life without commitments, that is, outside of the institutional or law-like codes of a profession. By refusing to enter a profession, one is free, not bound by externally imposed rules of conduct. But the Neutralist is not a libertine. Though she does institute her own code of conduct, it is not for the sake of pleasure and entertainment that she does so. Rather, the goal is virtue. As Shapiro explains, “the voluntary commitments the Neutralist undertakes . . . are guided by the natural commitments all human beings share, and through which we can understand divine law.” (57)

Jacqueline Broad’s “Marriage, Slavery, and the Merger of Wills: Responses to Sprint, 1700-01” reminds the reader of the enormous assemblage of explicitly misogynistic literature written during and before the early modern period, and of the responses women writers advanced in defense of “their sex.” Broad considers the works of three thinkers — Eugenia, Astell, and Mary Chudleigh — all of whom penned replies to the preacher John Sprint’s 1699 pamphlet, The Bride-Woman’s Counsellor, in which Sprint argues for a wife’s complete obedience to her husband. Broad claims that the responses by Eugenia, Astell, and Chudleigh are indicative of the movement away from the idea of “morality as obedience” and toward the idea of “morality as self-governance.” (68) She explains that each of these writers points to the psychological and logical impossibility of an “interiorized submission” (72) — of internally honoring a husband who does not merit such honor — and that each insists that God does not demand that women do that which is impossible. Liberty, Broad explains, consists in making right use of one’s reason, and using the God-given power to judge for oneself.

Karen Green’s chapter considers the distinction between liberty and license as it is drawn by Catherine Macaulay and some of her contemporaries (Octavie Belot, Louise Keralio-Robert, Catherine II of Russia, and Elise Reimarus). Green shows that Macaulay accepts the Lockean views that genuine liberty involves subjection to law and that it is properly understood as freedom from domination. These political commitments coupled with an endorsement of Locke’s rejection of innate ideas lead Macaulay to insist that “only government by certain forms of democratic institution will promote non-arbitrary law.” (88)

Lena Halldenius picks up on the theme of Lockean republicanism in “Mary Wollstonecraft and Freedom as Independence.” Halldenius explains that to be unfree on Wollstonecraft’s view is to be subordinated to arbitrary power, or to the capricious will of another. This means that a person can be correctly described as unfree “even if she is factually able to do all or most of what she wants to do.” (97) Such a person is still vulnerable to the arbitrary power of another, who may, whenever he likes, exercise his will in ways that will prohibit her from doing what she wants. Without resources to counter or avert such coercion, if it should occur, such a person is, on Wollstonecraft’s view, unfree. Halldenius explains that Wollstonecraft’s understanding of freedom as “being entitled” to act (101) serves to ground her arguments for women’s political rights.

Eric Schliesser’s chapter carves out a place for Sophie De Grouchy in the history of Liberalism by examining the distinction she makes between positive and negative rights and by showing that it is a version of the distinction famously drawn by Isaiah Berlin between negative and positive liberties. Schliesser points out that De Grouchy offers liberty (understood in the republican sense of freedom from domination) as an example of a negative right, and that she proposes that the laws of a state can work in unison with moral education to produce responsible, yet free, citizens.

Sarah Hutton wraps up Part I with “Liberty of Mind: Women Philosophers and the Freedom to Philosophize.” Hutton points out that for early modern women thinkers, the freedom to philosophize was not a matter of intellectual pluralism, as it was for male thinkers. Rather it was about the possibility of philosophizing at all. Given women’s exclusion from formal societies and institutions and from the informal social networks necessary to cultivate their intellectual capacities, Hutton claims that women thinkers created opportunities for intellectual life by taking advantage of the circumstances where their involvement was socially acceptable: religion, politeness, and domesticity. The case for the freedom to think is, she suggests, articulated in relation to those roles. She then makes clear the role “rational conversation” plays in the works of Madeleine de Scudéry, Damaris Cudworth Masham, and Astell in their attempts to help create appropriate conditions for the development of female philosophical life.

Hutton draws out explicitly what many of the essays in Part I implicitly address: the importance of education as a philosophical topic, especially as it connects to the idea of freedom as rational self-governance. The volume’s editors note that one consequence of this collection’s focus on women and liberty is that it uncovers just how prevalent discussions of education were in the works of early modern thinkers — both female and male. An example that illustrates this claim (though not mentioned in the text) is George Berkeley’s 1725 proposal to found a college in Bermuda that would educate Native Americans and colonists together in the liberal arts and sciences. This project occupied Berkeley for nearly ten years and was, in fact, partly influenced by Astell’s arguments for women’s education in Serious Proposal to the Ladies, yet it has received very little scholarly attention.2 The essays in Part I illuminate just how understudied the philosophy of education has been in the early modern period, despite its importance to many early modern thinkers.

Part II turns to metaphysical and religious notions of freedom and to questions related to free will and to agency. Deborah Boyle begins this section by arguing that Cavendish is an incompatibilist with respect to free will, and she explains the indeterministic, libertarian position that Cavendish advances about human freedom. Boyle endorses the view first introduced by Detlefsen that Cavendish’s theory of occasional causation requires that the parts of matter are self-determining (possess free will) and perceptive (sense what is happening in the bodies around them), and that this plays an important role in her conception of human freedom. Human beings are subject to the norms of nature, Cavendish holds, but they are not necessitated or determined to act in accordance with them. All of nature (including human action) is self-determining.

In “Anne Conway on Liberty,” Marcy Lascano considers issues of theodicy and the problem of evil in Conway’s philosophy. Addressing the question why God would create any creatures at all if they must be made capable of evil, Lascano explains several aspects of Conway’s view: God creates from the necessity of his own nature, and what God creates must have a nature different from his. God is perfect and immutable; therefore, what he creates must be imperfect and mutable. This mutability is based on a creature’s ability to choose either good or evil. Abusing the power to change, to move toward greater goodness, is what brings about evil. Lascano also explains the reason for Conway’s non-standard (for a Christian) views about punishment: Conway denies eternal damnation, arguing that it is inconsistent with perfect justice to penalize a finite transgression with an eternal punishment. Connecting this back to Conway’s ontology, Lascano explains that since mutability is essential to the creatures’ nature, to punish creatures for what they essentially are would be unjust. Creatures are punished only for their finite acts of willing incorrectly.

Alice Sowaal considers the relation of internal liberty to external constraint in the volume’s second essay devoted to Astell’s philosophy. Sowaal addresses the concerns expressed by some commentators that Astell’s emphasis on cultivating one’s internal liberty instead of protesting the external constraints leading to female oppression is at odds with her feminist aims because such an emphasis both promotes passivity and places a heavy burden on (largely) unschooled women to liberate themselves. Sowaal argues that Astell’s emphasis on internal liberty serves to “render moot” (180) the external constraints, so that Astell’s solution to female oppression turns out to be “viable, active, and fair.” (180). Sowaal explains that internal liberty arises for Astell primarily by making God the sole and proper object of one’s love, which allows for the cultivation of the God-derived passions of joy, generosity, and love, and for the renunciation of the bodily-derived passions of anger, fear, and resentment. This provides a woman with a “God-derived power of human strength,” (190) which makes it impossible even for a tyrannical husband to “take [her] humanity and turn [her] into [a] brute.” Instead a woman’s “humanity . . . , integrity . . . , and rationality remain out of reach.” (192)

Ruth Hagengruber’s chapter explores Emilie Du Châtelet’s approach to philosophical problems of liberty by paying particular attention to the systematic nature of her thought especially as this bears on the connection of physics to moral philosophy. Within physics, Du Châtelet considers liberty in terms of free will, which is a causal capacity to initiate movement. Du Châtelet came to endorse living forces, a concept that linked well with her moral and political commitments, in which she viewed humans as active entities, reflecting both their own forces and those acting upon them. As Hagengruber explains, “the fact of ‘powerless’ women, according to [Du Châtelet], is a sign that forces are in disequilibrium in an unbalanced society.” (204)

Emily Thomas rounds out the volume with an essay on Catharine Cockburn’s view of divine freedom. Thomas explains that though Cockburn is an intellectualist with respect to God’s creative acts, “there is a sense in which God is more free on Cockburn’s position than on rival intellectualist systems.” (206-7). Thomas explains that Cockburn rejects the conception of a best possible world and advances instead a plurality of created possible worlds. Whether Cockburn is advancing a form of “modal realism” or simply making a claim about the likelihood of inhabitable planets in other star systems remains somewhat unclear. The important point is that Cockburn understands moral fitnesses to be contingent. As Thomas explains, natural laws (from which moral fitnesses would follow) do not hold in every possible world; thus they are logically contingent. Different possible worlds have different systems of natural laws, but once God has fixed on a possible world, moral fitnesses necessarily follow. Thus, the moral fitnesses are logically contingent, but nomicly necessary. This is what affords God a greater range of choice with respect to his creative acts.

The ideas of liberty, autonomy, and freedom — so important to understanding the early modern period — explode on the pages of this collection. The essays place each thinker into a familiar philosophical context, but they do so in a way that does not reduce them to intellectual satellites of their better-known and better-studied male contemporaries. There are creative ontologies, compelling political arguments, and intriguing philosophical distinctions advanced by the philosophers included in this volume. Every scholar/teacher of the early modern period should attend to the variety of positions these thinkers bring to the philosophical table.

1 The problematic nature of repeatedly including biographical details of women writers in philosophical essays is pointed out by Jessica Gordon-Roth in our jointly-authored paper “The Visible and the Invisible: Feminist Recovery in the History of Philosophy,” presented at Recovering Women’s Past, University of Edinburgh, September 2016.

2 See Nancy Kendrick, “Berkeley’s Bermuda Project and The Ladies Library,” in Berkeley Revisited: Social, Moral and Political Philosophy, edited by Sébastien Charles (Oxford: Oxford Studies in the Enlightenment, 2015), pp. 243-257; and Nancy Kendrick, “Berkeley’s Bermuda Project in Context,” in The Bloomsbury Companion to Berkeley, edited by Bertil Belfrage and Richard Brook (London: Bloomsbury, 2017), pp. 21-48.