Women in Philosophy: What Needs to Change?

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Katrina Hutchinson and Fiona Jenkins (eds.), Women in Philosophy: What Needs to Change? Oxford University Press, 2013, 271pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199325610.

Reviewed by Peg O'Connor, Gustavus Adolphus College


This is a richly complex book that addresses what many women in philosophy unfortunately and easily can grant: there are some major problems for women (and for underrepresented males) in philosophy. While some of the problems may be caused by men behaving very badly, these are not really the subject of this work. That is not to say that these problems are not serious; they most certainly are. However, cases such as these are written off to the individual men without calling the discipline of philosophy into question.

This works plumbs the depth and extent of the systemic and structural problems of philosophy and the often more difficult to identify ways that the discipline excludes, marginalizes, and trivializes women philosophers and the contributions that we make to the discipline. To be crystal clear: this book is not anecdote; it is sharp philosophical analysis.

The reality is that the discipline of philosophy lags far behind other disciplines in the humanities in terms of number of women undergraduate philosophy majors, graduate students, and tenured faculty members. The best numbers indicate that women make up 21% of academic philosophers compared to humanities as a whole where women are 41% of academics. Our numbers are comparable to the physical sciences, where there has been more recent interest and intent to elevate the numbers. Women are 20.6% of academics in the physical sciences and 22.2% of the life sciences (7).

There are two why questions and a how question this book addresses. First, why does philosophy lag behind our humanities compatriots? And second, and more importantly, why should we care? Finally, how should we change this? These latter questions, of course, prompt some of the authors to explore who is included in the "we." Does the lower participation of women in philosophy matter to other women philosophers? Male philosophers? The discipline itself? Our students? Where and with whom does the onus for change properly reside?

Each piece in this collection grapples with some dimensions of these questions. Taken as a whole, the book offers a diagnosis of the discipline of philosophy. The diagnosis would be devastating if not for the equally interesting and compelling recommendations or treatments that many authors advance for transforming the discipline. The authors often refer to one another, taking the analyses of each other and extending them further and creatively adopting one another's strategies for making changes. This is a hallmark of a collection that is both well-conceived and well-executed.

It should be obvious that all philosophers should care about these issues for reasons of fairness and justice. It should be equally obvious that the discipline of philosophy is better when more voices and perspectives are included. But here's the rub: having commitments to justice, fairness, and inclusiveness may make it harder to see when we don't actualize them.

What make some of these problems and dynamics so difficult to diagnose is that they are so common and familiar that we just can't see them. They are also understood to be part of the nature of doing philosophy or part of the academic game; they're normal and normative.

Some of the problems diagnosed include the long history of professional male philosophers' criticisms of women's rational capacity (Marilyn Friedman), implicit bias and stereotype threat (Jennifer Saul), belief in meritocracy (Fiona Jenkins), difficulty in establishing credibility and authority (Katrina Hutchinson), problematic pedagogy (Catriona Mackenzie and Cynthia Townley), microinequalities (Samantha Brennan), and silencing (Justine McGill). Combine and compound the effects of all these practices, and one has very large systemic problems.

The systemic problems are solvable, and the essays offer a variety of prescriptions for addressing the particular practices that maintain and reinforce the exclusion or marginalization of women in philosophy.

The prevalence and staying power of stereotypes of women, our rational capacities and hence our abilities to "do real philosophy," require specific and effective treatment that Saul provides. One very concrete course of action is to educate members of hiring or review committees about the dynamics of implicit bias. Though people may have a commitment to Affirmative Action, we are often unaware of the ways that implicit bias hinders us from seeing a woman as "equally qualified," and thus undermines our commitments to fairness and inclusiveness.

The allegiance to meritocracy along with attendant beliefs about objectivity, disinterestedness, and fair criteria will be difficult to shake, especially for philosophers. Jenkins offers strategies for questioning the logic of meritocratic evaluation.

Some of the most important recommendations concern pedagogy and undergraduate education. There are significant drop offs in the number of women who take a philosophy class, who major in philosophy and who then go on to graduate school. More inclusive attitudes and pedagogical practices might function to stanch the exodus at all levels of education (Susan Dodds and Eliza Goddard). Philosophers might also consider additional methodologies, encourage methodological pluralism, and dislocate the adversarial method from pride of place (Hutchinson). Philosophers might also adopt different attitudes about and strategies for teaching philosophical skills.

Several of the authors acknowledge the dearth of women represented in many of the publications of our discipline. Whether it is a small number of women in the A-list journals or the absence of women in some of the best selling anthologies that we might consider for course adoption, a student might have the impression that women haven't -- or worse, can't -- make important philosophical contributions.

Thus, diversification of the curriculum is a recommendation of many of the authors. It is vital to incorporate more women into the curriculum. This is easier said than done.

I am not sure a review of a particular book is the appropriate place to raise questions with the publisher of the book. But given the subject matter of this book, it does seem more appropriate to ask about the dynamics of academic publishing. I am impressed that Oxford University Press has published this book. On the one hand, it is not surprising given their strong and robust list of feminist philosophy books. As one of the premier academic presses, an Oxford University Press book carries extra weight. In much the same way some individuals confer credibility and authority, an academic press such as Oxford does.

But back to the difficulty of diversifying the curriculum when women are underrepresented in the world of academic publishing: how well is Oxford itself delivering on the "What Needs to Change" subtitle of this work in the rest of its list? I admit that when I receive a free examination copy or a flyer for a new anthology or a new edition of an old stand-by, I do a quick inclusiveness test. In the past, many Oxford books didn't pass my test. But a recent flyer of several books in new editions makes me more hopeful that Oxford is making strides by including more women philosophers. This is a significant improvement.

So much needs to change in the world of philosophy. The changes that women philosophers can effect on our students and the discipline are sharply limited. Yes, there are some things that we can and should do for each other. One of the particular recommendations is mentoring. We can give good advice, suit up and show up for hiring and review processes. We can provide opportunities for professional development so that women can acquire the credentials that our discipline says matters. We can continue to write essays and collect them in books like this.

Women in Philosophy is a call for changes that need to be adopted by all philosophers but especially our male colleagues. Every philosophy department needs to have at least one copy of this book so that it can be passed around and then discussed. The discussions prompted will be philosophically challenging because the book is philosophy done well. May those discussions also bring about the kinds of changes that make philosophy better.