Women Philosophers of Seventeenth-Century England: Selected Correspondence

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Jacqueline Broad (ed.), Women Philosophers of Seventeenth-Century England: Selected Correspondence, Oxford University Press, 2020, 279pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190673338.

Reviewed by David Cunning, University of Iowa


Jacqueline Broad has produced a terrific volume and an invaluable resource for scholars and students. The volume showcases a large selection of letters in which four women philosophers of the early modern period -- Margaret Cavendish, Anne Conway, Damaris Cudworth Masham, and Elizabeth Berkeley Burnet -- exchange views with a number of their prominent philosophical, political, and scientific contemporaries. Broad provides an introduction up front that highlights some of the cross-cutting topics that arise across the letters -- topics in metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of religion, and ethics -- and then there are separate sections that contain the letters by the four women and their correspondents. The latter include Walter Charleton, Joseph Glanvill, Constantijn Huygens, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Jean Le Clerc, John Locke, and Henry More. Each of the four sections begins with an introductory segment that helps the reader to contextualize the material that follows -- for example, how a given letter is an early expression of a view or argument that one of the correspondents defends more fully in a later published work, or how one of the two correspondents undergoes a change in view. The volume includes a comprehensive index that allows the reader to locate the wide range of topics and figures that the letters address. Throughout the volume there are also footnotes that elaborate on less familiar terms and ideas and that provide references to important passages in other works. Broad dedicates the volume to Eileen O'Neill, a pioneer in the study of early modern women philosophers and leading figure in the study of the early modern period more generally.

The first section presents us with a selection of the correspondence between Cavendish and Hyugens, Charleton, More and Glanvill. In the exchange with Hyugens, we find a very early statement of Cavendish's view that artefacts are not nearly as sophisticated as natural productions (20). The view also appears prominently in her critique of More (for example pp. 50-54, 57-58), where Cavendish anticipates her argument that since brains are clearly able to think, there must also be mentality in the most basic elements that add up to brains (and other macroscopic bodies), and so we should not be surprised if natural productions engage in coordinated mindful behaviors and if artefacts (in which are bodies are more hurriedly thrown together) do not. We of course find the anti-materialist flipside of the argument in Leibniz, in Monadology section 17 and also in one of Leibniz's letters to Masham (209). It is important to note as well that not all of the letters that compose a given exchange are extant. In the case of Cavendish, Broad fills in the gaps by excerpting from the monograph Philosophical Letters, in which Cavendish engages a fictional "Madam" in a rigorous back-and-forth about the views of Hobbes, Descartes, More, Charleton, and others. It is telling that Cavendish would craft a fictional correspondence of this sort, but not surprising given the exceedingly brief and non-substantive replies that she received to the letters that she sent to Hobbes and More (9), for example. Also noteworthy is the question of the circumstances under which a letter becomes non-extant. Unless a writer produces a copy of each letter that they write, a letter will only survive if it is kept and preserved by its recipient. In the case of Cavendish (and also Conway), a number of the letters just aren't available.

The letters to Cavendish from Charleton and Glanvill are relatively lengthy and involve a direct engagement with her views, especially in the case of Glanvill. Charleton is at times dismissive, claiming for example that although her work is original, she is also "secure from being Copied" (47). He compares the work to the domestic efforts of "good Housewifes in the Country, . . . mak[ing] a feast wholly of your own provisions, yea even the dressing . . . " (46). Perhaps Charleton regards the latter language as somewhat complimentary, especially given some of the praise that we find in his other letters to Cavendish (35, 48), but it still betrays a value judgment that is highly problematic. Glanvill is a much more active and immersed interlocutor. He presents to Cavendish his views on witches and other immaterial forces in nature (68, 73), innate ideas that are under-determined by the inputs of the senses (79), and the limits of both metaphysical and scientific knowledge (74-75). There is a clear level admiration and respect in the letters from Glanville, highlighting the reciprocal back-and-forth that is essential to the kind of exchange that can benefit interlocutors in both directions. Cavendish had written in the preface to Philosophical Letters,

judg me neither to be of a contradicting humor, nor of a vain-glorious mind for dissenting from other mens opinions, but rather . . . it is done out of a love to Truth, and to make my own opinions the more intelligible, which cannot better be done then by arguing and comparing other mens opinions with them. . . . For a Philosopher or Philosopheress is not produced on a sudden.

As Broad notes in her introduction (4), men and women of the early modern period were similarly in need of venues to test out and refine their ideas. Cavendish herself was able to secure a correspondence with at least some of the prominent philosophers and scientists of her time.

The letters from Conway to More offer a window into the development of Conway's thought on God and the creation at the same time that they showcase critical feedback that she provides to More. The Conway letters also reveal an engagement with the central debates of the period, for example, when Conway expresses an early sympathy for the view (contra Descartes) that color and other sensory features are literally in material bodies (98-100). In a second letter she presents the seeds of a doctrine that she later defends in Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy (published in 1690, eleven years after her death). She poses to More a number of loaded questions about why God would create matter if it is so tightly connected to the occurrence of the Fall of humanity. In one case she asks "Whether God did create the Matter for the Enjoyment of Souls, since they fell by it?" (100). Later in Principles, Conway argues that because God is a supremely perfect being, all of God's activity is benevolent and just, and all of God's creation would be a manifestation of God's goodness. (Broad supplies a very helpful discussion of Conway's later position, pp. 82-85.) What Conway is suggesting in the letter to More is that a perfect God would not create matter if matter is understood to be dead, inactive, and non-perceptive being. So God did not create matter, and He did not create matter that enticed the Fall of humanity. Nor does God sentence us to an irrevocable and eternal punishment for having turned our attention toward a subset of His creation. More responds to Conway by attempting to articulate what he sees as the benefits of God's having surrounded us with (and having united our minds to) dead matter. He says, for example, that beings who have been saddled with it will experience a larger increase in happiness in the afterlife, when matter is no longer in the picture: "as he that can dance with Shackles will dance with more ease without them: And he that can run in his Boots, will more nimbly and easily run in his Stockins" (104). But Conway would still point to the worry that, in creating dead matter, God would be creating something that is entirely opposite His essence. In Principles she defends the view that strictly speaking matter does not exist. She does not thereby deny that tables and chairs and other familiar items do not exist, but just that they are not composed of matter. She is perhaps the first philosopher of the early modern period to defend that view, though versions of it of course appear later in the writings of Leibniz and Berkeley. Indeed it is in 1652 (in her letter to More) that Conway is already hinting at the view and at views in the nearby vicinity -- for example that the same God that does not create matter would also not punish a human being for eternity, but instead would provide space for human beings to steadily increase their perfection.

The exchange between Conway and More also helps to expose some of More's thinking in fuller detail. In response to Conway's view that there is no empty space and that the notion of empty space involves a contradiction, More offers a number of fresh (though not necessarily convincing) arguments for the view that it does not involve a contradiction (89-91), including a geometrical diagram that is meant to show that non-entities can have features like extension and dimension. More also defends his version of mind-body dualism by pointing to a swirl of different and opposing modifications that are had by each (93-94). Later in Principles Conway will appeal to a similar list of modifications, but also point to modifications that are in-between the extremes that are cited by More and that she takes to be evidence that mind and body exist on a monistic continuum.

The selected correspondence between Masham and Locke is fascinating to say the least. One of the exchanges treats the topic of religious enthusiasm. In response to Locke's dismissal of religious enthusiasm as having no epistemological value, Masham notes that Locke might be thinking too narrowly of enthusiasm and indeed that there appears to be a version of it that readies the mind for reflection -- a "Divine Sagacitie which is onely Competible to Persons of Pure and Unspoted Minds and without which Reason is not successful in the Contemplation of the Highest matters" (133-34). In another exchange, Masham presses Locke on how an empiricist can account for the formation of an idea of eternity in a finite human mind. Masham argues that the content of that idea does not represent eternity, but merely finite time repeated; that wouldn't be an idea of eternity at all (184). Here she is gesturing at her own (Cambridge) Platonism and hinting that there are other entities about which Locke thinks we can reason -- for example God -- but where Lockean empiricism does not allow us to have ideas of them. Masham argues that at the very least finite minds are pre-formed with dispositions and traces, without which many of our ideas would never take shape (183). A third topic that is prominent in the exchanges between Masham and Locke is the question of whether or not the ethical doctrine of Stoicism can be lived by embodied human beings. For example, Masham says that if Epictetus and others are correct, then "Reason Teaches me . . . to be Contended with the World as it tis, and to make the Best of everything in it" (159). But then, almost in real-time, we see Masham distancing herself from a Stoic perspective and the Platonism that undergirds it. She has lost friends and loved ones (136-37); she benefits from companionship and sociality (138, 153); she says that regardless of the deliverances of reason her "Predominant Inclinations will I am certaine Always be the same and I shall never Help being well enough Opinionated of them Neither to oppose Them Or be Asshamed to Owne Them" (155). Masham is also extremely witty in fleshing out her positions, using irony and other rhetorical devices. She announces, for example, that "to be Happy One must Care for Nothing, nor Nobody, Have no Friends, Love onely ones self, Nor never take any Concerne in the Good, or Ill, of other people whoever they be" (143). It is particularly striking to read this language against the backdrop of the clear affection for Locke that Masham reflects in every page of their correspondence. The Masham letters to Locke are incisive, and they are playful.

The exchanges between Masham and Leibniz are just as rich, with Masham offering feedback that is critical but constructive. She worries, for example, about how finite minds can be free if God has pre-established all of their actions to harmonize with the behavior of bodies (214), about how it is difficult to make sense of the thought that monads are in organized bodies but are not extended themselves (204, 212), and about how it is important to be humble and circumspect when specifying the details of divine activity and drawing conclusions about the nature of the creatures that would (and would not) result from such activity (212). Leibniz also sheds light on his own thinking. For example, he attempts to explain his view that bodies often imitate reason but without having any actual mental states (229-30). He engages the discussion in response to Masham's view that the world of bodies is flush with immaterial "plastic natures" that act toward ends but without consciousness of what they do (224-26). Leibniz wants to say that if we are not ascribing consciousness to such entities, we should identify them as bodies instead. Leibniz also takes the opportunity to defend his view that our knowledge of necessary truths must be innate given that the "experiences or observations of the senses can never prove that a truth is absolutely necessary or must always obtain" (221). This is view with which Masham would apparently agree. Leibniz also advances positions that are much in line with positions that are endorsed by the other three women philosophers who are the focus of the volume. We have already seen similarities between Conway and Leibniz on the question of divine benevolence and the eternal improvability of creatures, but Leibniz also expresses alignment with Cavendish on the question of why natural productions are so much more sophisticated than artefacts. He says that a natural machine is

a machine whose parts are also machines, and consequently [i]s one whose subtle structure goes on to infinity, wherein nothing is small enough to be neglected, whereas the parts of our artificial machines are not themselves machines. Herein lies the essential difference between nature and art, which our moderns have not sufficiently considered. (209)

Cavendish dedicated a lot of time and a lot of written pages to the difference between art and nature, though she would disagree with Leibniz about whether all things (machines included) are at the most fundamental level composed of immaterial minds or thinking bodies.

The final section of the volume features a selection of the correspondence between Burnet and Locke. Something extremely interesting is happening in these letters. As Broad describes (231), a critical part of the background to the initial exchanges between Burnet and Locke is that Burnet is a close friend of Edward Stillingfleet, and Stillingfleet (in correspondence with Locke and also in the 1697 Discourse in Vindication of the Doctrine of the Trinity) is a forceful and dismissive critic of Locke's empiricist epistemology. Stillingfleet worries that Locke leaves no room for human minds to have knowledge of the Trinity, or of human souls or God. Even though Locke does not discuss the Trinity in his An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689), Stillingfleet still associates him with empiricist-minded thinkers like John Toland who reason from Lockean assumptions to conclusions that are explicitly skeptical and anti-religious. When Locke replies to Stillingfleet, Burnet points out to Locke that his particular responses are in many cases overly charged and hostile (238-48). She says that Locke supposes that the distinctions that he makes are perfectly clear when in many cases they are not (245-46), that his metaphor of the mind as an empty cabinet is not nearly as illuminating as he takes it to be (244), and that he uses terminology that is at least as incomprehensible as the terminology that his empiricist program promises to rectify or replace (247, 249). She encourages Locke to be much more humble and charitable in the course of communicating with his philosophical opponents. She tells him, "I confess I could have sometimes wished a little less sharpness in your last" (239), and tells him in the third-person, "I would desire him to be more cautious in speaking his thoughts, that his name ben't [be not] fixed to what is not his Judgment" (237). Burnet is not just pointing to considerations of etiquette. She also has in mind the stratospheric heights that are the workplace of the philosopher, and the humility and fallibilism that would seem to be appropriate in the course of proposing of a view on (for example) the origin of all ideas and knowledge. She writes,

if your way of proving and knowing is found a clear and easy method it will be aproved and used when time has smoothed the prejudices and stilled the fears of its opposers, and if it is not so and only shows the promised land of knowledg but brings not to it, it will like former skeems fall into disuse of itself. (244)

In a way, Burnet is reminding Locke of his own concerns about enthusiasm. If Locke is right that we are embodied cognizers, it is important to be on guard against the kinds of passion and impulse that a philosophical opponent might muster in hearing (and rejecting) a view, and it is important to be on guard against hostility and charge on our own side as well.

Many of the ideas that Burnet presents to Locke make their way into Burnet's later Method of Devotion, and Broad provides an extremely helpful discussion of the specifics (235). The volume is indeed an extremely valuable resource, and only a fraction of its contents could be addressed here. Some of the letters that compose each correspondence are no longer extant, but even in those cases Broad supplies context from numerous sources to fill in the gaps. And though we do not have all the letters ourselves, we are reminded that the exchanges were vigorous and vibrant at the time they took place and that women philosophers of seventeenth-century England were highly active and clearly impactful.