Women's Activism, Feminism, and Social Justice

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Margaret A. McLaren, Women's Activism, Feminism, and Social Justice, Oxford University Press, 2019, 278pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190947699.

Reviewed by Mechthild Nagel, State University of New York, Cortland


Margaret A. McLaren's monograph is a fabulous addition to the growing body of work in Oxford's Studies in Feminist Philosophy. It is unique in the series, as it showcases participant action research and first-person accounts of women's activism in India. McLaren's narrative account of two women's organizations is based on several field trips spanning over a decade.

McLaren is a well-known feminist Foucault scholar. I consider this volume more in line with her recent engagement in decolonizing feminist theories than building on Foucault's discourse on power. In fact, Foucault's name is only mentioned once, in a rather dismissive way, cited approvingly in an epithet on the first page. The epithet's author, Srilatha Batliwala, urges readers to listen and pay attention to poor women's demands and actions rather than to the re-articulations of Foucault or Gramsci's political theories. In situating her project, McLaren sets out to center poor, and low-caste and poor, Muslim women's lived experiences from two successful women's cooperatives and NGOs. She visited projects of Self-employed Women's Association (SEWA) in the city of Ahmedabad and MarketPlace India in Mumbai to learn how effective women-led cooperatives work and to study the impressive range of social justice issues these dynamic organizations are involved with. These case studies exemplify to me that a Western expert-driven approach would not be the best way of solving crises faced by women workers. For instance, if a worker deals with intimate partner violence in a U.S. context, co-workers would advise her to call a hotline and maybe go to a shelter with her children. McLaren seems surprised to learn that members in both organizations combat domestic violence directly by confronting the abuser and providing shelter, if necessary, for their co-op member (228). In fact, holistic organizing for peace and social change bypassing government or parastatal institutions is quite common across the Global South, and I would argue that much could be learned from avoiding the governance paradigm of feminist organizations that is so prevalent in the Global North. McLaren's analysis invites the scholar-activist reader to broaden her imagination and to support autonomous organizations for cross-border feminist solidarity.

McLaren's investigations show that much is to be learned from women's organizing. Her careful praxis philosophy shows the influences of decolonial and intersectional feminist theorizing pioneered by Linda Martín Alcoff, Kimberlé Crenshaw, Lila Abu-Lughod, Chandra Mohanty, and Uma Narayan, to name a few. They critique the white (Christian) Western savior complex haunting mainstream liberal feminism. And there is a common concern of speaking with the oppressed and acknowledging the agency of subjugated women, who face interlocking oppressions of heteropatriarchal institutions, racism, neo-colonialism, and discrimination based on caste and religious affiliations.

The first chapter introduces the case studies MarketPlace India and SEWA, and McLaren skillfully circles back to the inspiring work of these women's organizations throughout the remainder of the book. MarketPlace India is a clothing cooperative, providing fair wage and safe working conditions mostly for widows, who face many difficulties to secure enough resources for their children and aging parents. SEWA also provides a broad spectrum of resources for women working in the informal sector. Both organizations encourage leadership development and SEWA's workers have been successful lobbying for a convention for home-workers, gaining support from the International Labor Organization. MarketPlace India, founded in 1980, employs about 500 members with 13 cooperatives, while SEWA is the biggest women's union in the world with over 700,000 members (28) with its own member-owned savings bank (48). Clearly, neither organization fits a charity model -- but instead they cherish ideals of dignity, empowerment and activism, broadly conceived -- including fighting back against police who harass used-garment traders, whose work is illicit thanks to colonial law which outlawed informal trading (71-72). An important public health campaign focused on getting covers on raw sewage ditches, which immediately affects infant mortality rates and prevalent diseases such as malaria (41).

McLaren notes that confidence building of the co-op members of MarketPlace occurs in gender segregated spaces. Married women are allowed to work outside the home precisely because the husbands know their wives are in women-only groups. "Ironically, . . . this traditional gender segregation also serves to subvert traditional gender roles" (35). Puriben, a SEWA member and emerging leader, had to persuade her village elders to let her and other women artisans leave the village to attend SEWA meetings. She was successful because their work provided valuable income for the community (50-51). In another village, women were able to convince elders and government leaders to build a water tank, sparing women long walks to fetch water elsewhere (51). SEWA is also successful in cross-cultural dialogues and peace-building. Inclusive organizing means to represent every religion and caste in leadership (52-53). SEWA is also active internationally, having a sister organization in South Africa and being part of global grassroots trading networks (54).

Even though there is no similar vast network of cooperatives in the U.S., a workers' centered movement approach that has some affinity with McLaren's Indian examples is the national group Jobs with Justice. Decades ago, this organization was focused on racial justice in the community when traditional unions refused to take on any social issues not directly related to the workplace and work-related grievances. McLaren also mentions the Justice for Farm Workers Campaign of the Florida-based Coalition for Immokalee Workers (192-92). This food-based coalition has been successful with boycott campaigns to educate consumers about exploitation of farm workers and human rights abuses of multinational corporations such as Wendy's. McLaren justifies her study of Indian cooperatives arguing that these groups model successful transnational or cross-border organizing and feminist solidarity among women workers in the Global South. Moreover, it is a model for forging ties between producers and consumers, including consumers in the Global North (27).

In the second chapter, McLaren elaborates her critique of the liberal human rights agenda, prevalent in mainstream feminism that is disconnected from praxis considerations and lived experiences faced by workers in the Global South. She advocates a feminist social justice framework that is best suited for the demands of transnational organizing.

McLaren presents a concise genealogy of women's rights in United Nations forums and conferences. She correctly assesses the mixed record: on the one hand, recognition of the call for women's rights as human rights presented opportunities of gender inclusion, on the other hand, it was imposed in a culturally imperialist way ensuring the continued dominance of a Eurocentric, secular, hyperindividualist ideology (62-63). The endorsement of gender mainstreaming at the 1995 Beijing women's conference does not get mentioned, even though it became codified in government's policies for gender equality, and, one might add, serves the neoliberal agenda that McLaren deftly criticizes. However, she does present a critique of the Millennium Development Goals as being part and parcel of the problematic rights-based discourse (95).

Since Rosalind Petchetsky, a prominent white, reproductive rights scholar, is mentioned in the U.S. context, it seems to me important to juxtapose her individualist health care approach to the holistic framework offered by a Black feminist activist, Loretta Ross, the co-founder of SisterSong, based in Atlanta, Georgia. McLaren mentions correctly that women of color "founded the reproductive justice movement" (73). Arguably, it is Ross who introduces the rallying cry for reproductive justice, which deeply resonates with communities of color, including Indigenous women's activists (Ross et al., 2017).

McLaren concludes the chapter by endorsing a value pluralist account: "One can argue that a universal application of rights without attention to the historical, political, cultural, and social particularities of a society is imperialist, while still acknowledging indigenous conceptions of rights, dissent, and protest that appeal to a normative framework" (89). Instead of celebrating a women's rights ideology in the Western liberal tradition, McLaren argues for a feminist social justice approach which focuses on women's empowerment, "which combats internalized oppression and centers women as agents of change" (95).

In chapter 3, McLaren centers her feminist analysis on the big economic picture -- the drivers of global development and the trappings of microfinancing on the poor who work in the informal sector in the Global South. She provides a much-needed comparison between microfinance and cooperatives to explain that it is the latter that truly empower poor workers, especially women. McLaren's critique gives a good overview of the underside of neoliberal policies, with its privatization schemes ("structural adjustments") and wealth and resource extraction through enterprise zones (i.e., capital's "free trade") that have led to devastating immiseration. Although some of the economic data probably should have been updated, her philosophical argument on oppressive global inequality and exploitation is still valid. She is optimistic that cooperatives such as MarketPlace India and SEWA are poised to thwart the impact of global capital and lending institutions (e.g., IMF and World Bank) at the micro-level and truly empower women (101-105). Drawing on the situated knowledges of South Asian feminist activists such as Batliwala, women empowerment practices must challenge systems of oppression, demand access to all kinds of resources, and, ultimately, transform institutions (113).

If cooperatives are feminist and therefore egalitarian through its participatory democratic structures and female empowerment commitment, microfinance institutions such as Mohammad Yunus' Grameen Bank in Bangladesh are leaning towards a masculinist, neoliberal poverty lending approach. McLaren notes that women are much more burdened with microfinance schemes in multiple ways: poor women get poorer through outright dispossession, when exorbitant lending fees are levied; when they are unable to repay, lenders threaten their families, and suicide rates spike (123-25). Powerfully, McLaren concludes that microfinance schemes enforce an economy of shame and do not contribute to poverty alleviation (126). By contrast, cooperatives value, in theory and practice, democratic values such as equality, equity, and solidarity (129), which are, naturally, the core values of both of her case studies.

In the fourth chapter, McLaren gives us a theoretical foundation for tackling global inequality. She contrasts Rabindranath Tagore's relational cosmopolitanism with those of Martha Nussbaum's individualist version and of the proponents of institutionalist cosmopolitanism (142-43). While all of them critique nationalism, as cosmopolitanism's Other, Tagore best captures a respect for diversity and cultural differences, and gives a robust alternative to the Western Kantian and human rights-based ideology, which McLaren finds woefully unsuitable for the challenges of building bridges and global solidarity networks. She revises Tagore's relational theory by drawing on the intersectional work of feminist theorists María Lugones, Audre Lorde, Chandra Mohanty among others (160).

McLaren's advocacy for a relational cosmopolitanism is tremendously helpful in moving us beyond the monochromatic rational man model of the Kantian paradigm. Tagore's model is employed to critique a Western imperialist lens and it is a resource for validating the local, rather than dismissing it all together (169). Interconnection and interdependence are cherished values which McLaren relates to Martin Luther King's social justice model (173). This seems to me appropriate since both of them accomplish a postsecular turn in their utopian visions for the beloved community. Critiquing the caste system, Tagore does not commit himself to a romantic cultural defense, and at the same time, he also rejects American superiority claims by suggesting that whites have not treated Indigenous peoples and Black Americans justly (176). McLaren is drawn to Lugones' rich metaphor of "world traveling" to affirm value pluralism and a loving perception for cross-border organizing (182). It's clear that this chapter on the variations of cosmopolitanism prepares the reader for the final chapter's exploration of a robust solidarity social justice paradigm.

The final chapter is devoted to Iris Marion Young's later work on a social connections model and political responsibility for global social justice. Young's work is an important resource for McLaren's theoretical approach, because it centers the problematic of social oppression and economic exploitation. McLaren also provides a robust response to Young's critics, specifically to Carol Gould, while offering her own critique of Young's singular focus on collection action (187-89). Moreover, McLaren takes issue with Young's disregard for moral responsibility (191).

Young's theory is strictly focused on political responsibility; she rejects moral theory because it would be tarrying with the negative: assigning guilt and blame, which is a backwards oriented liability model. However, as McLaren points out, even political actions such as boycotts and petitions blur the line between individual and collective action, as well as moral and political responsibility (191-92). Gould faults Young for not pursuing a human rights agenda, but since McLaren finds that Young simply focuses on structural injustice and thus emphasizes a different aspect of responsibility (198). Next, McLaren extends Young's advocacy for anti-sweatshop campaigns to Fair Trade as a social movement, even though Young considers Fair Trade impractical (205). McLaren connects this defense to her case studies, which benefit from Global consumers' support for Indian artisan products. Furthermore, even multinational corporations such as Nike could be pressured successfully to rethink their labor practices as they faced boycotts of the anti-sweatshop movement (210). However, I believe much of it is window-dressing and accomplished with the help of celebrity sports figures, and Nike remains in the spotlight for eliding decent standards in its subcontracted factories.

Ann Ferguson raises an interesting issue of prioritization: should a solidarity paradigm be considered more fundamental than political responsibility? Young considers political responsibility as a stepping stone for transnational solidarity work (213). In the end, McLaren sides with Ferguson that a solidarity commitment powerfully grounds transnational activist work, including challenging state violence.

How is it possible to reconcile power differentials among world travelers, such as McLaren, and Indian women who join a cooperative and have never used a phone or traveled outside their village? What of internal power differences of cooperatives? While this may not be the subject of this book, an author committed to non-ideal ethical theory might want to address communicative strategies and repair work when members lose track of the common goals and wish to usurp power. McLaren gestures at the problem of internal conflicts (189), but I do not see any discussion of what those conflicts entailed and how they were solved.

I highly recommend this book as a supplemental text for undergraduate classes in social philosophy, women's and gender studies, economics, and other social sciences. It is also accessible for a general audience, for organizers and policy analysts, as well as graduate students and experts in the field. It provides a rich overview of pressing political and economic global issues by using two outstanding case studies from India.


Loretta J. Ross, Lynn Roberts, Erika Derkas, Whitney Peoples, and Pamela Bridgewater Toure (eds.) Radical Reproductive Justice: Foundations, Theory, Practice, Critique. New York: Feminist Press, 2017