Wondrous Truths: The Improbable Triumph of Modern Science

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J.D. Trout, Wondrous Truths: The Improbable Triumph of Modern Science, Oxford University Press, 2016, 241pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199385072.

Reviewed by Mark Newman, Rhodes College


The principal idea of this short but entertaining popular book is that the standard narrative about how science arose across Europe, the one that tells us progress in scientific discovery during the seventeenth century was the result of the inevitable march of scientific method, is incorrect. Rather than being the result of sustained and diligent application of method, successful science is a consequence of hitting upon correct theories through a mixture of accident, luck, geography, and personal idiosyncrasy. Trout makes this rather dramatic claim because he sees a problem with scientific method's single common rule of inference, inference to the best explanation (IBE). The problem is that this rule is subject to evaluative bias. In particular, IBE relies upon the evaluation of explanations -- we infer to the truth of the best explanation we have available -- but the evaluation of explanations is itself dependent on our 'sense of understanding'. This sense of understanding is unfortunately not a reliable feeling, often as much leading to belief in falsehoods as truths. This means that it can't be IBE which alone is responsible for the success of science. So, what is? Trout's answer: the feeling of understanding becomes more reliable the more we are surrounded by good theories (p. 6). Scientists that luck onto good theories are more likely to select good theories in the future, and this is just what happened with the scientific revolution.

Of course to substantiate this argument Trout must address several important questions: What is this feeling of understanding of which he speaks? How does this feeling arise in us and why does it persist if it is unreliable? Is IBE a good inductive rule despite relying on the sense of understanding? What conditions must hold if a lucky break is to result in progressive science? What caused the luck that lead to the rise of science in 17th century Europe? He provides answers swiftly, in just over two hundred pages, which is quite some feat, and because this book is an exercise in bringing philosophy to the masses rather than a tightly argued academic monograph, readers shouldn't be too disappointed if gaps in the arguments appear here and there. In what follows I'll sketch much of what he covers, with a few critical comments peppered in along the way.

What is this sense of understanding? It is that familiar sense we get upon grasping an explanation -- that it just 'feels right'. It is the intellectual satisfaction one receives when a question has been answered adequately. Furthermore, it is the feeling we use when deciding to accept a good explanation. Unfortunately, Trout points out, not all explanations which feel right are right. We often get the feeling of grasping an explanation even if it is incorrect. So, Trout separates the notion of understanding from that of a good explanation. Explanations, he says, are good when they provide accurate descriptions of causal factors that generate a phenomenon. He calls this the "ontic" account. It treats explanations as mind-independent, having nothing to do with anything anyone actually understands, or thinks they understand.

How does this feeling of understanding arise and why does it persist even when misleading? This sense of understanding arises from grasping a correct causal explanation, which gives us feelings of pleasure, accessibility, and confidence. We will often favor explanations that are easy to process. They provide a sense of what Trout terms "fluency", which is the affective result of having easy-to-process elements in an explanatory story. Fluency is used as a heuristic by scientists for evaluating explanations, but it is subject to cognitive biases, such as overconfidence and hindsight. As such, fluency is capable of creating an explanatory analog of 'false climbs' -- a phenomenon common with inexperienced pilots flying in the dark without instruments, whereby they blindly follow their feeling of climbing, except that due to a perceptual illusion they are actually accelerating downward. They sadly steer straight into the ground.

So fluency is an unreliable heuristic. But how unreliable is it? Well we don't get a specific reliability ratio from Trout, but he thinks the history of science testifies to fleuncy's unreliable track record. Not one to shy away from bold claims, Trout asserts that "most of the history of science was a false climb" (p. 51).

In his third chapter, having already introduced the idea of fluency and reported its prevalence, Trout turns to the question of its physiology. How does fluency arise in our bodies? His answer comes via a brief excursion into the neurophysiology of learning. None of the details are particularly important here, but his overarching idea is that we humans like to learn and are rewarded with good feelings when we do so. (We are subject to mu-opiod receptors that give us a good sensation when we make associations between the parahippocampal cortex at the back of the brain and stored memories elsewhere. This provides a biological basis for getting a good feeling out of learning).

This is all very nice, but it is easy to miss perhaps one of the most interesting and novel philosophical contributions of Trout's book which appears here buried in the biology of chapter three: four conditions necessary for our feeling of understanding to become a reliable indicator of accurate beliefs. This is much more interesting than the neurobiology because here Trout seems to be suggesting a set of conditions which are at least necessary if not sufficient for connecting the sense of understanding with truth. They are (pp. 60-62):

1. You must be in possession of the correct theory which explains the phenomenon in question.
2. You must balance one's desire for an end to explanation with the unending nature of explanation.
3. You must have enough mental workspace, and models, to evaluate the causes being entertained.
4. You must learn to control the sense of excitement and that of reward when confronting a possible explanation, and this has to be taught.

Now if you're wondering what all this means, you're not the only one. Unfortunately Trout doesn't slow down to explain each of these conditions in any detail, so the reader is left with a rather vague idea of what he's talking about. Still, as a set of initial stabs at connecting our sense of understanding with truth they might be taken to mean something like: our sense of understanding is reliable only if generated by a true theory/explanation with which we have facility in solving problems which are not influenced by poor cognitive behavior, such as wishful thinking.

If this is the sort of thing Trout has in mind it isn't so far from some of the current literature pushing a factive approach to understanding in combination with some aspect of virtue epistemology. That is, much of the recent discussion over understanding has focused on questions regarding whether what one understands can be achieved despite having a false explanation. Many of those advocating for a virtue-reliability based approach to understanding -- that we understand only if we make use of our reliable cognitive virtues -- advocate for the necessity of at least approximately true explanations. It is into this camp Trout seems to fall.

Next, Trout addresses the reliability of IBE. First off, unlike many, he takes all inductive inferences in science to be explanatory, and as such, they fall under the general rubric of IBE. Second, he defends scientific realism by taking IBE to be really good when applied to true theories, though terrible when applied to false theories. In fact, that's pretty much his whole argument: IBE has contributed fantastically to scientific progress when theories are true enough to get the general causal structure of the world right, and terrible otherwise. Thus, we've not seen progress with poor theories, but have with those that are approximately true. Add in the caveat that background beliefs contribute to successful theorizing (and hence that true theories are revealed and confirmed by their coherence with prior beliefs), and you've got Trout's realist response to critics like Bas van Fraassen, Larry Laudan, and Kyle Stanford.

Despite this, one might still worry that IBE relies upon our sense of understanding, and hence without us knowing that Trout's conditions (1)-(4) are satisfied we don't have justification for thinking the world is as science claims. To address this issue, in chapter five Trout reiterates what he has been claiming throughout the book all along: A good explanation is an accurate one, whether we understand it or not, and no matter if we know we understand it or not. This is a clear statement of epistemic externalism about understanding. In Trout's view science has made progress despite our using a method which incorporates the misleading sense of understanding, and this has happened frequently because of accident and contingency -- by our fortuitously stumbling upon the truth.

If this sounds like hyperbole, Trout reminds us that hindsight bias is playing a role in how we might judge scientific progress to have been inevitable. As he emphasizes: "progress was driven by contingencies of creative talent, geographic location, social affiliation with the right people, the purposes of patronage, access to raw materials, and the needs of industry or the military." (p. 117) In fact he goes so far as to list and explain in some detail six specific types of contingencies which are responsible for the rise of science: psychological, environmental, timing, historical, cultural, and biological. Unfortunately, just as with his conditions on understanding above, Trout doesn't spend much time defending his thesis that these are the contingencies responsible for the rise of science. This is perhaps okay for a popular book, but even in this format I found his brevity startling.

What is nice about this chapter on contingency is how he moves on to address the relationship between understanding and explanation. Given the objective nature of his ontic account of explanation it should come as no surprise that Trout takes understanding to be a separate and independent concept; though many would disagree because they take a good explanation to be one which provides understanding to someone. Not so for Trout. He argues that it is perfectly sensible to come across cases where we have a good explanation but don't much understand it -- as with quantum systems for instance. This is partly because there are contingent limits to the cognitive capacities we humans have for understanding the world. The overarching idea he pushes is that understanding is acquired through explanations, but explanations can be correct even though they may provide little understanding. Trout claims we don't yet have an account of incomplete understanding, though one is necessary to accommodate this phenomenon. For him it will take a psychological form, explaining the cognitive limits of our minds and why they prevent us from grasping the truth in theories that, for example, use computer simulation of multivariable systems, or try to explain consciousness, or quantum effects. In this way we'll achieve comprehension of why science has managed to make substantial progress despite our limited ability to understand some of its explanations.

Finally, Trout closes his argument with a chapter outlining Newton's achievement in developing the corpuscular account of matter out of correct physical convictions that went hand in hand with highly erroneous alchemical beliefs. The driving idea here is to provide a clear illustration of how science arose not due solely to the deliberative application of scientific method by faultless scientists, but rather through the accidents and contingencies of applying IBE to cases where we were fortunate enough to stumble upon the truth.

In closing, I'd like to make a few comments about Trout's overall take on understanding. As we've seen he adopts an objective approach to understanding whereby genuine understanding is a cognitive achievement dependent upon possessing a correct explanation for some phenomenon. The feeling of understanding can be misleading so understanding ought to be interpreted with an externalist epistemology -- one ought not assume that because an explanation seems to provide great insight we should accept it as true. This may be so, but there are a host of now well established questions that have been addressed in the literature on understanding but which Trout completely ignores in this book. This seems to me to be a rather significant lacuna. For instance, although many believe explanations must be at least approximately true in order to provide understanding, this is in conflict with the obvious truth that science uses idealizations, abstractions, fictions, and counterfactual scenarios to enhance our understanding. Trout's rather straightforward story doesn't tell us how to account for this prevalent practice. This is unfortunate because whereas some, like Michael Strevens, see idealizations as contributing to our understanding by highlighting the idle-wheels in our explanations, others, like Henk de Regt, see the history of science as full of cases where false theories have been used to understand a phenomenon. Catherine Elgin doesn't see the facts as essential either, claiming our idealized models provide understanding when they exemplify important features of the phenomena, not necessarily when they capture truths about it.

Another issue ignored by Trout is related to the norms of understanding. He adopts an externalist approach, but it might plausibly be argued that understanding requires that agents have transparent access to how they grasp explanatory, probabilistic, and inferential relations embedded in explanations. Perhaps this internalist impulse mimics access approaches in epistemology, or perhaps there is some other route to accounting for what many consider the hallmark that distinguishes understanding from mere knowledge: that we make connections between the propositional content expressed in the explanations we possess. Whatever the set of norms adopted for the task it is apparent that Trout is not engaging with much that has and could be said on this issue.

Lastly, Trout fails to clearly distinguish understanding from propositional knowledge. The reductive approach which takes understanding to merely be knowledge seems likely his view, but he doesn't lock horns with any of the standard arguments articulating non-propositional knowledge accounts of understanding. Some for instance take understanding to require know-how rather than merely knowledge-that, and specifying how much and in what sense is an important ongoing route of investigation -- one again ignored by Trout in this book.

In Trout's defense he does in the preface honestly address the question of why he isn't engaging with academic technical problems; they are simply too distracting for a short popular book on science. This claim is however contradicted where in chapter four on IBE he does precisely this, arguing with Laudan, van Fraassen, and Stanford regarding scientific realism. Perhaps we can excuse him this lapse of commitment to the idea of keeping things non-academic, but as a book trying to explain many of the details behind understanding -- attested to by chapter three's biological descriptions and four criteria for understanding -- it would have been very nice to see at least some engagement with these important questions.

Despite these limitations, this is a very nice book advocating an original approach to how science got from there to here. I strongly recommend it to anyone even remotely interested in history and/or philosophy of science.