Words and Images: An Essay on the Origin of Ideas

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Christopher Gauker, Words and Images: An Essay on the Origin of Ideas, Oxford University Press, 2011, 288pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199599462.

Reviewed by Edouard Machery, University of Pittsburgh


Christopher Gauker's new book is a rich and innovative study of the nature of conceptual thought, its relation to language, the relation between concepts and perception, and the place of imagistic thinking in cognition. Many more topics are broached in passing, including the alleged ambiguity of "concept" in psychology and philosophy (contra Machery (2009), this term is used unambiguously to refer to the constituents of judgments), the myth of folk psychology (it is not true that we predict and explain behavior by ascribing beliefs and desires), the proper interpretation of Kant's opaque theory of concepts, the non-conceptual nature of perceptual content, and the nature of meaning (strictly speaking, words don't have any meaning, although we use the word "meaning" to prescribe how words should be used), and the views of many philosophers (Sellars, McDowell, Prinz, Gärdenfors, etc.) and psychologists (Rosch, Mandler, Barsalou, Tversky, etc.) are critically discussed.

Words and Images is divided into a critical and a constructive part. In the critical part (Chapters 1 to 4), Gauker sharply scrutinizes the views about concepts he believes are mistaken, occasionally rescuing an insight from the ruins his criticisms are supposed to leave behind. Chapters 1 and 2 focus on the views that, in different ways, tie together concepts and perception: first, the Lockean view that concepts are abstracted from perceptions, then the Kantian view that concepts are rules of synthesis of perceptions. Chapter 3 examines Churchland's and Gärdenfors's view that concepts are regions of a hyperdimensional mental space. Chapter 4 discusses Sellars's functionalism, Fodor's nativism, and Brandom's normative functionalism.

In the constructive part (Chapters 5 to 8), Gauker develops his own views, starting with the nature of imagistic cognition and its place in cognition (Chapters 5 and 6). Chapter 7 explains how assertions are guided by imagistic representations, while the final chapter defends the identification of conceptual judgments with linguistic assertions in inner speech (which, as Gauker emphasizes, should not be confused with the inner perception of sentences).

The broad outline of Gauker's theory of conceptual thought is familiar: concepts are words, judgments are assertions in inner speech, and there is no conceptual thinking without language. While we've heard that story before, Gauker's remake is worth a detour. This is due in large part to the role played by imagistic cognition. Non-human animals and human beings are hypothesized to possess non-conceptual (in contrast to Gärdenfors's theory), perceptual hyperdimensional mental spaces (think of, e.g., the space of colors), over which similarity measures are defined. (Apparently, we have several such spaces; unfortunately, Gauker does not explain how they are related to one another and how they are organized.) Points in a perceptual space represent perceived or imagined particulars, and their location determines which properties these are represented as possessing. Represented particulars are more or less similar to one another, depending on their distance in these hypothesized perceptual spaces. Causal relations of a limited type (e.g., a billiard ball pushing another one) can also be represented in them. In contrast to particulars and some causal relations, kinds are not represented. For instance, points representing dogs happen to be clustered in the same region of space and to be closer to one another than they are to points representing cats, but their referents are neither represented as dogs nor as forming a kind. Representations of kinds are conceptual, and require a language. Imagistic representations can be more or less accurate, and to that extent they can misrepresent. Endogenously controlled imagistic representations are used to solve many different types of problem. In fact, Gauker goes out of his way to showcase how much can be done with these representations and without concepts -- one of the most interesting aspects of his book. Cognition in non-human animals is exclusively imagistic, and much of human mental life is imagistic too.

Imagistic representations guide the use of words in assertions (including in inner speech) and thus the occurrence of concepts in judgments. Linguistic competence involves being disposed to make various types of assertions in response to various kinds of perceptual representations. Focusing on a simplified language containing atomic (demonstrative + predicate, e.g., "this is red"), disjunctive, and conditional sentences, Gauker maps these kinds of sentences onto different kinds of imagistic representations. Acquiring a language consists in acquiring the relevant dispositions. Perceptions do not provide us with reasons for our judgments (these are not inferred from perceptions, but caused by them), but we are justified in judging the way we do when our judgments are caused by imagistic representations in the right way.

There is much to like in Words and Images. It is ambitious and deals with a fundamental question in the philosophy of mind -- the nature of conceptual thinking. It is full of bold, iconoclastic views  (e.g., communication does not consist in conveying thoughts, words do not have any meaning, behavior is not explained by means of belief and desire ascription), detailed arguments for these views and against competing ones, and careful discussion of possible objections. It moves swiftly between philosophical arguments and psychological hypotheses and results, which is very fitting for the topic.

Before focusing on Gauker's positive claims about conceptual thinking, I will first record a minor reservation with the critical part of the book. Gauker sometimes recycles well-known arguments, and the reader who is conversant with the literature on concepts may find some developments a bit slow. More importantly, despite being canonical among philosophers of mind, some of these arguments are poor. For example, it is often said that if concepts were bundles of beliefs, then we could not change our minds (Gauker uses a version of this argument against Gärdenfors). Changing our mind involves having a belief at t2 that contradicts a belief held at t1, which is possible only if we possess the same concept at t1 and t2. But, if concepts are bundles of beliefs and if beliefs change, then we do not possess the same concept at t1 and t2. We can change our mind, and so concepts are not bundles of beliefs. This argument looses its appeal when concepts are viewed as individuals: What makes a concept at t1 and a concept at t2 the same concept is the psychological continuity between the bundle of beliefs that constitutes the former and the bundle that constitutes the latter (Machery, 2010 in response to Hill, 2010).

Gauker's positive proposal will probably leave readers unconvinced. Let's focus first on imagistic cognition. As we saw above, imagistic representations do not represent particulars as belonging to kinds. This claim seems to be challenged by the phenomenon of categorical perception -- viz. by the fact that there are boundaries between regions of perceptual spaces such that a pair of points across a boundary is judged to be more dissimilar than a pair of points within a bounded region even when the distance between points is the same for both pairs (e.g., Harnad, 1987; Gauker is aware of this phenomenon, p. 169). Gauker would probably deny that the categorical nature of perception shows that perceptual representations represent kinds. However, this response is unconvincing since the mind treats all the points within bounded regions of some spaces identically: for instance, in the space of phonemes, all r's are r's, function identically in speech perception. More generally, as Matthen has convincingly argued (2005), much of perception consists in digitalizing, i.e., in treating diverse things as being the same. Thus, the ventral temporal cortex includes a sequence of representations that forms a hierarchy of invariances, as shown, e.g., by Tanaka's work. Suppose now that perceptual spaces can represent kinds. This does not entail that perception involves concepts, as Gauker notes in a different, but related context (p. 166), but it means that kind cognition does not require a language. And, if kind cognition does not require a language, then one of the important characteristics of concepts (viz. that particulars that belong to their extensions are represented as being in some sense the same) is not language-dependent. This weakens the need for identifying concepts and words.

Second, Gauker is explicit that not all dimensions are innate and that perceptual spaces can acquire new dimensions. But, since their dimensions are necessarily perpetual (they are "dimensions of perceptual variation," p. 95), it is only the looks or appearances of particulars that are represented in perceptual similarity spaces. If perceptual spaces represent only the looks of particulars, there are limitations to what can be done by representing them in perceptual spaces and by computing their similarity. In particular, any evidence in comparative and developmental psychology that behavior depends on treating perceptually dissimilar objects similarly would undermine the role Gauker assigns to imagistic cognition. It would not straightforwardly follow that animals and non-linguistic babies have concepts and thus that concepts are not necessarily words, since a distinct, non-perceptual and non-conceptual kind of representations could be ascribed to them., But this evidence would probably be more easily explained by a proponent of non-linguistic concepts than by Gauker.

Third, the plausibility of Gauker's views depends on his capacity to explain the behavior of non-linguistic animals (non-human animals and babies) by means of his hypothesized perceptual similarity spaces. He dedicates twenty pages to this task (pp.163-183), but his discussion left me unconvinced. The problem is not that it is obviously mistaken. No, the problem with Gauker's exercise in post-hoc explanation is that his theory is vague and makes few clear, specific predictions. As a result, it is largely a matter of ingenuity and imagination to find explanations consistent with it. If Gauker's theory made specific predictions, then it would be quite a feat to show that the behavior of non-human animals and of babies are exactly those that are predicted. Unfortunately, this is not the case.

I will finish with a brief discussion of Gauker's views about how perceptual spaces guide assertions (Chapter 7). Gauker's exposition is puzzling. He apparently views his account as an empirical hypothesis about how concepts are acquired, but it is nothing of the sort. What it is is a speculative description of the target of language and concept acquisition: what one has to learn to be a competent speaker and thinker. But, Gauker has nothing to say about how the dispositions that for him are constitutive of linguistic and conceptual competence are actually acquired. This is particularly damning since one of his key general concerns with other views of concepts is that they cannot explain how concepts are acquired. Similarly, after having read Chapter 7, the reader will have no idea how the relevant dispositions are acquired.


Harnad, S. (1987). Categorical Perception: The Groundwork of Cognition. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Hill, C. (2010). "I love Machery's book, but love concepts more." Philosophical Studies, 149, 411-421.

Machery, E. (2009). Doing without Concepts. New York: Oxford University Press.

Machery, E. (2010). "Replies to my critics." Philosophical Studies, 149, 429-436.

Matthen, M. (2005). Seeing, Doing, and Knowing: A Philosophical Theory of Sense Perception. Oxford: Oxford University Press.