Words without Objects: Semantics, Ontology, and Logic for Non-Singularity

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Henry Laycock, Words without Objects: Semantics, Ontology, and Logic for Non-Singularity, Oxford University Press, 2006, 224pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199281718.

Reviewed by Adam Sennet, University of California at Davis


The subtitle of Words without Objects reads 'Semantics, Ontology and Logic for Non-singularity', and some might reckon this false advertising. The author offers no semantics for plurals or mass nouns. He adamantly claims that the problems of the many and the much are distinctly semantic, not ontological. There is no logic for mass and plural nouns. Nonetheless, WWO is an enjoyable polemic that grapples with some of the interesting and confusing issues of non-singularity, bringing semantic, ontic and logical considerations to bear on the puzzling phenomenon of non-singular nouns.

Laycock announces early on that the book is intended as neo-Wittgensteinean therapy for a malady I'll call 'singularitis'. Singularitis causes the belief in singularism, the view that all reference and quantification can and should be explained in a meta-language that is exclusively singular. Singularism is not without its charms. For example, reference seems to be a word-object relation and it would be nice to be able to give a referential semantics for all of English. The semantics of the variable that ranges over single objects is well understood, and it is tempting to think that the values comprise everything that exists. There is an ontological intuition that fundamentally the world is composed of single, unified things and the relations that hold between them. After all, I am a thing. Run me through a grinder and you will have Adam Sennet all over the floor. Grinding me, however, should not fundamentally change anything even if it ends my life.

Prima facie challenges to singularism, however, abound:

(1) Two men met in the bar.

(2) Lana and Amy can beat up Pekka.

(3) The gold in John's ring is very nice.

(1) cannot be reduced to:

(1a) *A man met in the bar and a different man met in the bar.

on pain of ungrammaticality. (2) can be true while (2a) false:

(2a) Lana can beat up Pekka and Amy can beat up Pekka.

In (3) 'gold', unlike 'cat', offers no principled way to individuate an object, the gold.

Of course, singularism is not thus refuted any more than Idealism is by the kicking of a stone. (1) may be singularized by quantifying over two-membered sets of men, (2) by treating 'Lana and Amy' as referring to a group (sum or set) and (3) by treating 'the gold' as referring to a mass of gold. In each case, the relevant paraphrase involves single discrete objects. If you can swallow sets, sums and/or masses, perhaps life with singularitis isn't so bad.

Laycock's strategy is to argue that some of the prominent analyses on offer are fundamentally misguided and impose false semantic constraints on non-singular nouns. He begins by considering the semantic and syntactic nature of plural nouns and mass nouns, the latter being distinguished from the former by being essentially 'non-count' (NCN) -- they do not submit to considerations of number but only of quantity; in this way, NCNs represent a more radical departure from singular terms than plurals, which occupy a middle position.[1] With this in mind, Laycock turns to his first singularist target: Vere Chappell's contention that NCNs such as 'the gold in my ring' denote an individual object. Chappell's argument for singularism depends on an apparent fact about identity: '=' denotes a relation between a thing and itself. The truth of (4): 

(4) The paper that was a page in that book is now the paper in my paper airplane.

requires that there be something, the paper, that survives the change from page to airplane. Identity over time requires the identity of a thing. Thus, whatever else is true about 'the paper', it had better refer to a single entity, which Chappell calls a 'parcel'. Parcels are distinguished partly by their insensitivity to form -- seeing as NCNs typically refer to things that can alter in form fairly dramatically.

Laycock responds by considering the ice in a drink. Two things seem true about the ice in the drink: (i) when the ice starts to melt, there is strictly speaking a different amount of ice than what was put in the drink. On the other hand, we are also inclined to think that (ii) the ice will only cease to be when it has melted entirely. Laycock claims that (i) and (ii) are not contradictories but contraries. They would be contradictory, however, if 'the ice' denoted a single entity, such as a Chappellian parcel. A single object can't both persist and not persist but if there is no single object denoted by the description, then there is no object for the property 'persists' to be true of. Conclusion? 'the ice' doesn't denote an object at all.

We can collect temporally connected series of ice parcels and associate the sum with the denotation of 'the ice'. This would help capture the intuition that as it melts, the ice is strictly speaking not the same ice one began with (since the two ice parcels are connected but distinct). Laycock insists that this analysis 'would not and could not acknowledge the fact that the ice that was added to the G & T will not have ceased to be until all of it has ceased to be … as such, it could constitute no genuine analysis'. One has reason to worry about this argument. First, it is not clear just what notion of 'analysis' is sought after here. Second, the argument may show too much. Consider a red patch that is growing smaller by being erased. As it shrinks one is tempted to say that it isn't the case that the patch survives (i.e. the latter patch isn't identical) but also that it isn't the case that the patch is destroyed -- 'the patch' continues to refer.[2] One wouldn't want to conclude from this that the patch has no identity conditions nor that 'the red patch' fails to refer to a single object. 'Patch' is a count-noun and as such one suspects that NCNs are really as distinct from CNs in the ways that Laycock advocates. In particular, one suspects that atomicity is really at the heart of the matter. 

One interesting question involves mixed identity statements, and regrettably Laycock doesn't speak to these cases. For example, the following is true:

(5) My favourite thing in the world right now is the whiskey in this glass.

However, if 'my favourite thing in the world' is a singular count noun, we can deduce by Leibniz's law that 'the whiskey in this glass' refers to an object.[3]

Laycock next turns his attention to plurals. Singularitis can make plurals look paradoxical, especially in some cases of non-distributive predication. A predicate is non-distributive if it is predicated of a few things but not, per se, its members. (2) is ambiguous between a distributive and non-distributive reading. Consider numeric predications:

(6) Brown and Russell are two of Miss Smith's suitors.

The predication is non-distributive: Russell isn't two of Miss Smith's suitors and neither is Brown. But an oddity arises if we singularize the referent of the subject term: it isn't two of Miss Smith's suitors any more than Russell is.[4] Paradoxical conclusion: nothing is two of Miss Smith's suitors after all. The answer, according to Laycock, is to accept that (6) is not about anything though it is about some things. 'Brown and Russell' refers to Brown and Russell, not about the set/sum that has Brown and Russell as members/parts, nor about Brown and Russell separately.

Laycock gives another interesting argument against set-theoretic singularization. Consider the identity sentence:

(7) A and B are identical to C and D.

A set theoretic treatment, waiving some fine points, renders (7) as:

(8) {A, B} = {C, D}.

(7) and (8), according to Laycock, have very different semantic properties. (8) must be  ‘understood as expressing a bona fide relationship of identity -- one that is unique and fully determinate -- obtaining, if true, for just one set or collection under two distinct designations' (p. 70). (7), however, enjoys no such status. Unlike (8), 'this sentence does not itself express a unique and fully determinate relationship of identity… There is an obvious sense in which it is, precisely, incomplete for thought … ' (p. 70-1). According to Laycock, in other words, (7) is equivocal and (8) is not. Thus, (7) and (8) are semantically distinct.

I think we ought to be wary of confusing truth conditions and meaning. Consider an analogue of (7):

(9) A and B fed C and D.

(9) enjoys a reading on which A feeds one of C and D and B feeds the other. (9) is not somehow imperfectly specified or ambiguous on this account. It is, to borrow a term from linguistics, sense general between the two. Similarly, it is by no means obvious that we should impute interesting partitioning of the truth conditions of (7) to its meaning.

Chapter 3 concerns definite descriptions that contain an NCN as a head noun. 'The blood in my veins', for example, presents a prima facie challenge to the Russellian theory of definites (RTD): 'the blood in my veins is red' can't be truly paraphrased as:

(10)       [(∃x) (Bx &((y) By x=y) & Rx)]

After all, if  ((∃x) Bx) is properly translated as 'there is some quantity of blood', the uniqueness clause is violated as there is no unique sample or quantity of blood in my veins. Thus, we have a prima facie argument either for singularism or against the RTD. Not surprisingly, Laycock defends the RTD. The argument against RTD depends on the singularities-caused belief that 'the blood in my veins' is a singular definite description. It doesn't and so the objection to the RTD is spurious. Conclusion? The critic of the RTD gets things wrong by taking the phrase 'the blood in my veins' to denote a single object. 

As far as the point goes, I agree that the attack on RTD is unwarranted. However, let's reconsider the red patch mentioned above. Presumably half a red patch is a red patch; the description 'the red patch' is also apparently improper. But 'the red patch' seems to successfully denote nonetheless and it denotes a single object if it denotes at all. This is cause for suspicion that the RTD can teach us much about singularism and non-singularism. This is no great surprise, however: there is no general shortage of counterexamples to the uniqueness component of the RTD.[5]

Chapter 4 examines some logical considerations in a post-singularitis world. The following two arguments seem valid:

(Pa1) All men are mortal.                         (Pb1) All blood is red.

(Pa2) Socrates is a man.                           (Pb2) That is blood           

(Ca)  Socrates is mortal.                           (Cb)  That is red.

Notice the shift between the plural in (Pa1) and the singular in (Pa2) -- 'men' to 'man'. Singularism requires that we paraphrase (Pa1) into:

(11) If something is a man, it is mortal.

The paraphrase seems truth conditionally equivalent, if not synonymous, with the original. This, however, distorts the logic of 'all', which is special in its ability to only take plurals and NCNs.

NCNs and non-distributive predication present problems to the paraphraxis strategy. We cannot paraphrase (Pb1) as:

(12) *If something is a blood, it is red.

Similarly, we cannot treat 'some blood is red' as 'at least one blood is red'. Similar points attend (13):

(13) All men like to drink together ≠ *If something is a man, it likes to drink together.

Of course, there are available paraphrases in all these cases. In particular, it is tempting to suggest that we paraphrase (Pb1) as:

(14) ∀x (Quantity of blood x ⊃ Red x)

But only singularitis makes these paraphrases look attractive: curing singularitis allows one to see clearly that the paraphrase does not preserve the special semantic features of the original. In particular, it doesn't allow a clear view of words such as 'all' that seem designed to take non-singular nouns as restrictors. Among singularitis' bad symptoms is the imposition of an 'alien' logic on non-singular nouns and quantifiers. The unsolved problem, however, is how to provide a non-alien logic of non-singularist quantification.

The chapter ends with an intriguing suggestion: "the quantificational generality of the standard predicate calculus may be said to rest on the solid ground of singular reference." (p. 136). The general idea is that we understand 'All men are mortal' by understanding what it is for something to satisfy the predicate 'man'.[6] This raises a puzzle: how do we reconcile our considerations regarding NCNs and plurals with the demand that quantification ultimately be understood as a generalization of singular reference? Or, more simply, what do NCN quantifiers quantify over?

This question provides a nice segue to the final chapter, called 'The Ideal Language Program'. The notion of an ideal language rears its pretty head most famously in the works of Frege, Russell and Quine. Laycock sets out the following conditions for an ideal language:

(i)    There must be explicit encoding of the semantics in syntax (ambiguity and the like are distinguished syntactically).

(ii)  The semantics of an ideal language sentence must encode ontological categories, i.e. variables take individuals as values, predicates do not refer, etc.

(iii) It should reflect the categories contained in the natural language fragment at work.

One may well balk at these, especially (iii): why think that natural language categories will be preserved at all when we go ideal? Nonetheless, the conception of a language that joins natural language (fragments) and the world is of independent interest. This leaves us with the deep question:  if singularism is false, what does 'the blood in my veins' denote? What variables can we use to represent NCN quantification, and what referential semantics can we use to interpret them? Are we forced into paradoxically admitting non-entities that are the referents of NCNs? In other words, how can we satisfy (ii) and (iii) by reconciling the semantic category of NCNs with a suitable ontological category?

Laycock, in one of the more frustrating moments of the book, does not answer this question. He suggests that the sting of the paradox can be lessened if we are clear on plural cases that similarly violate the word-entity relationship. Contrast:

(15) The geese have been hanging out in the yard since dawn.

(16) Some geese have been hanging out in the yard since dawn.

(17) Geese have been hanging out in the yard since dawn.

(15)'s truth requires that the same geese have been hanging out in the yard during the relevant time span. The truth of (16) (on one reading) and (17) requires that some geese or other have been hanging out in the yard. (16) and (17) seem to resist ideal language formalization in just the same way that NCNs resist such formulation. What value would we assign to a variable bound by 'some geese'? Whatever value we gave the variable would inevitably be the wrong one since it need not be the same geese that do the hanging out in the yard. Similar points attend:

(18) The water has been present in the basement since last week.

(19) Some water has been present in the basement since last week.

(20) Water has been present in the basement since last week.

(18) and (19) (on one reading) are identity involving: the same water that was in the basement last week is still there. (20), however, can be true even if the water in the basement has been replaced over and over again in the past week. (20), like (17), prima facie resists ideal language treatment. Thus, there is no special mystery about non-entities and denoting. There are no special non-geese that are to serve as the denotation of 'Geese' in (17). There is simply a way of talking about geese that isn't identity involving, much like the case of NCNs.

We should be suspicious of this line of thought. There is a natural way to understand (16) and (17) in terms of scope. Presumably we can represent the 'non-identity' use of (16) as:

(21)      ["t: since dawn t] [Y: Geese Y] (In (the yard at t, Y))[7]

There need be no particular geese in the yard since dawn for (21) to be true.[8] Amazingly, Laycock actually suggests this analysis. The same, of course, cannot be said about NCNs, which, if Laycock is right, cannot be quantified over using the normal apparatus of first order logic. (15)-(17) do seem to submit to paraphrases prima facie consistent with singularism while (18)-(20) do not. It is thus not clear that we are any closer to solving the mystery we started out with: how can we make semantic sense of NCNs and their denotation? It isn't clear that (16) and (17) offer any insight.

Words Without Objects is a worthwhile read for anyone interested in some of the philosophical considerations regarding the many and the much. At times one wishes that Laycock would delve a bit deeper into the dialectic. At others, one wishes that his linguistic considerations were a bit more sophisticated -- linguists such as Link (1983) are well aware of the non-atomicity considerations involved with some NCNs and employ non-atomic lattice structures to account for the lack of atoms. A discussion of these sorts of views would add to the case against singularism. But the book contains some very insightful and interesting arguments about a very difficult topic, and provides some delightful philosophical back-story.[9]



Lewis, D. 1983. 'Scorekeeping in a Language Game'. Chapter 13 in Philosophical Papers, Volume 1. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Link, G. 1983. 'The Logical Analysis of Plurals and Mass Terms: A Lattice-theoretical Approach', in R. Bäuerle, C. Schwarze, A. von Stechow, eds., Meaning, Use, and Interpretation of Language, 302-323. Berlin, New York: Springer.

Ludlow, P. and Segal, G. 2004. 'On a Unitary Semantical Analysis for Definite and Indefinite Descriptions'. To appear in Bezuidenhout, A. & Reimer, M., eds., Descriptions and Beyond. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

McKay, T. 2006. Plural Predication.  (Oxford: Clarendon Press). 

[1] In particular, the case of 'non-atomic' NCNs is of interest: furniture is categorized as 'atomic' by Laycock since intuitively there are smallest discrete units of furniture. Not so for 'wine', 'water', and 'gold'. 'Furniture' intuitively is associated with things: couches, chairs and the like. However, most of the arguments Laycock gives are applicable to 'furniture' just as much as to 'wax', 'gold' and 'water'. One may also wonder whether atomicity is a semantic or ontic property: could we have found out that there were natural atomic units of wine?

[2] If a patch starts to lose some of its patch-parts and one asks if the original patch survived, one is tempted to answer 'some of it did and some of it didn't', just as Laycock says about the melting ice. (p. 41)

[3] One might be tempted to treat this 'is' as predicative about the whiskey, namely, being my favourite object. Fair enough: Kripke taught us tricks to get around this. Let me stipulate that 'Jenna' refers to my favourite object in the world. 'Jenna is the whiskey in this glass' appears to be true.

[4] Notice, to make things worse, you can add a distributive predicate to (6) such as 'and are 5'10" each', which suggests that whatever the semantics of the subject 'Brown and Russell', it must be a possible subject for distributive predication.

[5] See Ludlow and Segal (2004) for an overview and a defense of a version of the RTD which drops the uniqueness assumption even for count nouns.

[6] This is contentious: McKay (2006), for example, presents a first order logic that eschews singular variables altogether and allows an understanding of the singular in terms of the plural.

[7] I've allowed myself a plural variable for ease of representation. I remain neutral on the proper interpretation of the variable -- singularist or otherwise. Importantly, it involves no quantification into predicate position and as such we don't assume from the notation that it is a second order variable.

 [8] (17) is, on account of its genericity, more difficult to deal with, but fortunately there is a great deal of literature on the semantics of bare plurals -- see Carlson (1977) for example. In particular, bare plural phrases always tend to take the analogue of low scope. 'Jane wants to meet Swedes' has no interpretation on which 'Swedes' scopes over the 'wants'. Thus, the single reading of (17) is predicted.

[9] Thanks to Sam Cumming, Pekka Väyrynen, Julia Bond, Michael Glanzberg, Megan Wallace, Kathrin Koslicki, Jonathon Weisberg, Mark Steen, Jessica Rett and Ted Sider for helpful discussions.