"Work on Oneself": Wittgenstein

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Fergus Kerr, "Work on Oneself": Wittgenstein's Philosophical Psychology, The Institute for the Psychological Sciences Press, 2008, 119pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780977310319.

Reviewed by Danièle Moyal-Sharrock, Birkbeck, University of London


This short book is somewhat of a classificatory puzzle. It is difficult to pinpoint its nature and its aim. The subtitle promises a commentary on Wittgenstein's philosophical psychology, but as we get to the end of the first chapter, itself entitled 'Wittgenstein's Philosophical Psychology', we have had little more than an introduction to Wittgenstein's life and some familiar 'truths' (truisms, really) on his philosophical psychology -- mostly via the Cambridge Lectures on Philosophical Psychology: 1946-47. The problem is that there are only three chapters left to the book, and the next one is entitled: 'Wittgenstein and Catholicism'. However, once we recall, from the Foreword, that the book is destined to an audience of scholars and students working in the psychological sciences, and to other non-philosophers, we are reconciled to the fact that this is not going to be a work à la Ter Hark, Budd or Johnston.

The book, then, comprises four chapters; the second of which, 'Wittgenstein and Catholicism', is the most adventurous. Kerr claims that Wittgenstein's rejection of the rationalistic Catholic apologetics he was taught in his youth played a crucial part in the inauguration of his later philosophy; indeed, that Wittgenstein 'constructed his later philosophy very much on the basis of bits and pieces of what it is easy enough to regard as central to Catholicism' (46). Wittgenstein's loss of faith, which he himself dated to his schooldays, never put an end to his interest in Christianity, as evidenced both by his interest in such authors as Tolstoy, Dostoevsky, Kierkegaard and Augustine, and by the several comments and incidents listed by Kerr as testimony to the philosopher's Roman Catholic sensibility. Kerr insists that, though not a practicing Catholic, 'Wittgenstein was never completely free of his Roman Catholic inheritance … "Once a Catholic, always a Catholic," in those days!' (43). And here we begin to wonder whether the author will know to draw the line between the legitimate acknowledgement of roots and influences and the illegitimate assumption that those influences have infiltrated and directed the core, albeit implicitly.

Kerr rightly remarks that though Wittgenstein rejected any theoretical, doctrinal and intellectual component in religion, he was deeply attracted by ceremony and ritual. Indeed, his reading of Frazer's Golden Bough not only produced the anti-rationalistic Remarks we know, it also positively reminded Wittgenstein of 'the worthwhileness of ceremony'. However, what Wittgenstein missed in Frazer, speculates Kerr, was 'natural piety'; for while not himself an observant Catholic, Wittgenstein had a natural piety which enabled him to respect the varied forms that awe and reverence can take, particularly with regard to the sources of life. Unfortunately, the author makes nothing here of the subtle associations of the Existential and the religious in Wittgenstein's thought. Yet we remain open to his suggestion that the philosophy of the later Wittgenstein developed from 'this insight, this discovery, this recollection, that ceremonies are valid, that religious practices have significance just as they are, and not because they are based on anything would-be scientific or theoretical or intellectual or metaphysical' (52). The later Wittgenstein's philosophy would have sprung, then, 'from this double event -- repudiating rationalism in Catholic apologetics and respecting the place of ritual and ceremony in human life' (52). The debt to William James's emphasis on practice is also acknowledged: Wittgenstein's hostility to the idea that religious practices are founded on doctrines (theories) might have come straight out of The Varieties of Religious Experience. But all in all Kerr maintains that Wittgenstein's anti-intellectualist, practical stance towards religion has its roots in his discovery of the priority of ritual over doctrine in the Catholic religion, and that it finds broad resonance in his later characteristic insistence on the priority of action and practice over thought and theory in the whole of human life. The author also sees Wittgenstein's work, early and late, reaching back to the ancient practice of philosophy as a 'way of life' -- as 'spiritual exercises'.

This would all certainly be worth contemplating -- if not as unassailable biographical fact, certainly as adding texture and fiber to the fabric of Wittgenstein's later thought. But then the canvas becomes overstretched as Kerr adds the private language argument to those fundamental Wittgensteinian themes that he finds rooted in Catholicism. Wittgenstein is seen to have taken, probably unwittingly, the essentially Catholic line against the Cartesian or Protestant picture of the soul as radically private: 'there is no experience, so there is no experience of God either, which is not mediated' (58). And so the author finds it appropriate to conclude that Wittgenstein's view of the dependence of the individual mind on the institution of language is indebted to his life-long interest in, and exposure to, Catholicism. Here, Kerr has stretched his line of argument to airy thinness: what seemed to be a natural, coherent, connection has turned into a forced fit. And unfortunately, the awkwardness is now felt to overshadow the whole.

Chapter 3, 'Wittgenstein, Psychology, and Psychoanalysis', is an acute and spirited summary of Wittgenstein's attitude to science and Freud. Though a trained engineer, Wittgenstein had a great fear of what Kerr calls 'scientism', and all his life sought to prevent us from thinking that the sciences reveal more about us than they really do. He combated the virulent idea that a complete understanding of human psychology was attainable through science, and that reaching it was only a matter of time. Of course, as Kerr is right to remind us, Wittgenstein was not hostile to science or to scientific research in psychology. He considered the scientific investigation of the role of rhythm in music a worthwhile project (he gave a lecture to the annual meeting of the British Psychological Society on rhythm), and was not set against the use of drugs, shock therapy and other physiological techniques in the treatment of psychological conditions. What was philosophically problematic for Wittgenstein was simply the assumption that advances in science would eventually give us the key to what it is to be human.

Wittgenstein's objections to Freud are given a brief but very adequate account: the reductive association of all psychological problems to sexuality; the attempt to make a science out of primitive mythology, which results only in the generation of new myths; the detrimental cleverness and wit of Freud's 'fanciful pseudo-explanations', which make them so popular that 'every ass now has them at hand for "explaining" appearances of sickness with their help' (p. 71); the dangerous 'charm' wielded by the picture of people having subconscious thoughts -- like the idea of an underworld, a secret cellar. Wit, cleverness and charm being the culprits here, I couldn't help relishing the thought of what Wittgenstein would have done with Derrida.

In the last chapter, 'Wittgenstein and "Other Minds" Skepticism', Kerr retraces Wittgenstein's attempts, in passages of the Investigations, to explode the philosophically-generated notion of 'consciousness'. As Kerr has it, Wittgenstein views consciousness both as an empty notion that fails to explain or describe or identify what is unique about human beings, and as a false conception of what we human beings are like. Still, we are given a lively aperçu of Wittgenstein's exploding, indeed ridiculing, the philosophically-generated abstraction. Kerr does this through a clever reconstruction of Wittgenstein philosophizing: we see how the philosopher first compares and contrasts the psycho-philosophical uses of the concept with its ordinary uses, and then actively seeks to experience 'pure consciousness' (by concentrating on nothing apart from his consciousness; trying to contemplate no particular thing, etc.). The upshot of this little exercise is the demystification of this kind of 'introspection' as in fact nothing more than a state of attentiveness on the part of the philosopher as he repeats the word 'self' to himself and tries to analyze its meaning. The result is a lesson in 'metaphysical illusion'.

As to the section on Wittgenstein and skepticism, it turns out to have only to do with Cavell's Wittgenstein. Kerr clearly enjoys the theological and Existential resonances he finds in Cavell, and adopts Cavell's interpretation of Wittgenstein on skepticism wholesale. And so it is to Cavell's reading of On Certainty that we are treated, along with its attendant errors. These are, on my view, Cavell's failure to see that Wittgenstein makes a categorial distinction between 'knowledge' and 'certainty', and his ensuing conclusion that Wittgenstein concedes a 'truth' to skepticism: that knowledge is not attainable because we really 'know' something if all possibility of doubt is excluded. Here, Cavell fails to understand that it is with his concept of 'certainty' -- of logical certainty (a certainty which excludes the possibility of doubt) -- that Wittgenstein delivers a fatal blow to skepticism. And so it is Cavell's view and valuation of skepticism, unduly transferred to Wittgenstein, that we are served: i.e. 'the truth of skepticism': 'an acknowledgement of human limitation which does not leave us chafed by our own skin, by a sense of powerlessness to penetrate beyond the human conditions of knowledge' (Must We Mean What We Say? 61). This, pace Cavell, bears no relation or resemblance to Wittgenstein's thought.

A pessimistic leitmotif runs through the book -- that we will, and indeed should, finally despair of making sense of Wittgenstein's philosophy. Such exegetical pessimism is to be deplored. I see it as connected to the refusal, on the part of the extreme therapeutic (or 'New Wittgenstein') wing of Wittgenstein studies, to acknowledge that there is palpable, substantial content in Wittgenstein's philosophy, and that it is there to be interpreted, well and less well.

In 'Work on Oneself': Wittgenstein's Philosophical Psychology, philosophers will find gentle reminders of some important philosophical facts about Wittgenstein, facts that we need to better and more widely communicate, such as that Wittgenstein is not a linguistic philosopher who sees human beings living in a language bubble from which they never escape. As to non-philosophers, they will find a very readable rendering of Wittgenstein -- albeit overly poised on a theological reading; on a tendency to find more Catholicism in Wittgenstein than is there, and less originality.