Working from Within: The Nature and Development of Quine's Naturalism

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Sander Verhaegh, Working from Within: The Nature and Development of Quine's Naturalism, Oxford University Press, 2018, 218pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190913151.

Reviewed by Gary Ebbs, Indiana University, Bloomington


The unifying theme of Sander Verhaegh's excellent new book is that in W. V. Quine's view, "as inquirers, we all have to start in the middle" and "we can only improve, clarify, and understand the system 'from within'" (p. 7). To "work from within" in the sense that is central to Quine's philosophy, Verhaegh explains, is to reject all of the supposedly extra-scientific, a priori standpoints imagined by traditional philosophers, and to construct one's theories using only methods and vocabulary that are continuous with the methods and vocabulary of the sciences.

This is the first historically-informed, book-length account of these central aspects of Quine's philosophy. The book incorporates six of Verhaegh's papers, the earliest from 2014, assembled and reworked so that their arguments each shed light on the nature and development of Quine's philosophy, and a trove of new material. Like several previous accounts of Quine's philosophy, Verhaegh's account draws on Quine's published writings and letters, as well as secondary literature about Quine's philosophy. What sets Verhaegh's interpretation apart, in addition to its focus on the development of Quine's philosophy, is that it also draws on hundreds of documents from the Quine archive at Harvard University's Houghton Library. Verhaegh's insightful interpretations of these archival documents inform his correspondingly perceptive new readings of Quine's published writings. The result is a rich and illuminating account of the nature and development of Quine's philosophy.

One of the many valuable scholarly contributions of the book is to show that it was only in the late 1960s, long after Quine developed the central tenets of his philosophy, that he began using the word "naturalism" to describe it. Verhaegh argues persuasively (in §7.5) that Quine's decision to start using the term "naturalism" to characterize his philosophy was partly prompted by his reading of John Dewey's book Experience and Nature as he prepared his paper "Ontological Relativity" for presentation as his Dewey Lectures at Columbia University in 1968.

One of the many valuable philosophical contributions of the book is to explain in detail, and from many different points of view, how Quine's naturalism systematically challenges the idea, still popular among some analytic philosophers today, that philosophy is an a priori discipline whose topics, methods, and vocabulary are essentially distinct from those of the natural sciences. I discuss some of the book's many contributions to our understanding of this important theme below.

The book has an introduction (chapter 1) and two main parts. Part I, which comprises three chapters, presents Verhaegh's readings of Quine's arguments for his naturalized epistemology, Quine's naturalized metaphysics (ontology), and Quine's commitment to working from within, respectively. Chapter 2 argues that in 1952 Quine gave up on the traditional epistemological project of justifying science in terms of our sense data because "he became convinced that the very idea of a sense datum language is not epistemologically prior to but dependent on our best scientific theories of the world" (p. 28). Chapter 3 argues that in rejecting Carnap's views on ontology, "Quine did not aim to restore the legitimacy of metaphysics, but rather to criticize the Carnapian view that [as Quine summarizes it in "On Carnap's Views on Ontology"] 'statements commonly thought of as ontological are proper matters of contention only in the form of linguistic proposals'" (p. 46). Chapter 4 presents Quine's naturalism as the conjunction of two components: his "rejection of any detached science-independent perspective on reality" and his "prima facie acceptance of our inherited scientific theories and methods" (p. 54).

Part II, which also comprises three main chapters, studies the historical development of Quine's naturalism. Chapter 5 argues that Quine's development in the 1950s of his mature, naturalistic conceptions of sensory experience and observation sentences were the key breakthroughs that enabled him to complete Word and Object, his first and most comprehensive statement of his mature philosophy, in 1960. Chapter 6 presents new evidence from the Quine archive that by 1943 Quine had already concluded that Carnap's efforts to define analyticity in formal semantical terms are unsuccessful. Chapter 6 also analyzes what Verhaegh calls Quine's "wide-scope holism," which Quine first formulated in §5 of "Two Dogmas." It defines a maximally inclusion reading of wide-scope holism, for instance, as the view that strictly speaking each scientific prediction draws on science as a whole, i.e. the totality of accepted sentences (p. 127), and argues that, contrary to what many Quine interpreters claim, Quine never gave up maximal inclusion (p. 139). Chapter 7 explains why, according to Quine, "there cannot be a strict distinction between science and philosophy" (p. 141) and explores some of the consequences of this central theme of Quine's philosophy. This chapter also contains the section I mentioned above (§7.5) that explains how and why Quine came to use the word "naturalism" to describe his philosophy. Finally, the Appendix of the book assembles, transcribes, and makes available in print for the first time several of the archival documents that inform Verhaegh's account of Quine's naturalism and its development.

At the start of Part II, Verhaegh writes, "Just as Quine himself aims to understand the justificatory structure of science by adopting a genetic approach, I examine the structure of Quine's naturalism by studying the evolution of his metaphilosophical thinking." (p. 79). Quine's genetic approach seeks to explain in naturalistic terms how a child with no prior language comes to learn a scientific theory, construed as a momentarily fixed complex of dispositions to assent to sentences. It clarifies the relation between our present scientific theory and impacts at our nerve endings. It is not obvious, however, in which respects this relation is analogous to the structure of Quine's naturalism. Perhaps by "structure of Quine's naturalism," Verhaegh in effect means "methodological structure of Quine's naturalism," at the heart of which lies Quine's systematically scientific applications of the method of working from within. If this is right, then Verhaegh may be suggesting that the relation between theory and evidence revealed by Quine's genetic method is analogous to the relation between a newly adopted theory and evidence that is clarified by an examination of how we arrived at the new theory by revising a previous one. The latter relation, if clarified, would perhaps also clarify what Quine calls scientific method (e.g. in Word and Object, §§5 -- 6).

To pursue the inquiry suggested by Verhaegh's analogy, understood in the way I just sketched, we need to know what theories Quine took seriously at the start of his career and why he became dissatisfied with them. Verhaegh of course realizes this. One of the great merits of his approach in the book is that he does not take standard accounts of Quine's starting points and dissatisfactions for granted, but seeks always to ground his explanations of Quine's development in sensible readings of Quine's published work and a large number of revealing documents Verhaegh found in the Quine archive.

Most of the details of Quine's development are best read and evaluated, I think, in light of the fact that early in Quine's career he endorsed the spirit, and in many cases also the letter, of Rudolf Carnap's philosophy. As Quine reports in his "Homage to Carnap," written in 1970,

Carnap was my greatest teacher. I got to him in Prague 38 years ago, just a few months after I had finished my formal studies and received my Ph.D. I was very much his disciple for six years. In later years his views went on evolving and so did mine, in divergent ways. But even where we disagreed he was still setting the theme; the line of my thought was largely determined by problems that I felt his position presented. (Quine 1970, p. 464)

Quine earned his PhD in 1932, so presumably his six years as Carnap's disciple were from 1932 to 1938. One theme of Quine's naturalism that he sees as continuous with Carnap's philosophy is that we can do no better than work from within the scientific theories we inherit. Quine often cites Otto Neurath's metaphor of science as a boat that we must repair and improve while we are at sea. In the same vein, in notes from 1965 that Verhaegh includes in the Appendix to Working from Within, Quine writes that one of positivism's insights is that "we must work within a growing system to which are born" (p. 189). This is evidence that Quine takes himself to inherit the method of working from within from the positivists, including his mentor Carnap, who, "more than anyone else," according to Quine, "was the embodiment of logical positivism, logical empiricism, the Vienna Circle" (Quine 1970, p. 464). Carnap himself explicitly endorses a method of working from within disciplined by strict scientific methods. In a paper from 1934 that Quine surely knew, for instance, Carnap says his new logic of science "is in the process of cutting itself loose from philosophy and becoming a properly scientific field, where all work is done according to strict scientific methods and not by means of 'higher' or 'deeper' insights" (Carnap 1934, p. 46; cited in the book, p. 5, footnote 13, where Verhaegh writes, "Carnap's reconception of philosophy as the logic of science . . . can be read naturalistically").

By Quine's own retrospective account, then, he began his career with a carnapian metaphilosophy, and the development of his thought was, as he says, "largely determined by" problems that he found with Carnap's position. Assuming Quine is right about his own philosophical development, we should expect to find that his philosophical views developed by solving what he took to be internal problems with the carnapian metaphilosophy he started with. Relative to this expectation, some of Verhaegh's interpretations Quine's philosophical development are surprising. I shall discuss three examples.

Example 1: Artificial languages and analyticity

Verhaegh cites a passage in a letter Quine sent to Carnap in 1943 in which Quine argues that when Carnap stipulates that "the following sentences are to be analytic in my new language," he does not thereby clarify what it is for a sentence to be analytic (p. 75). Verhaegh's interpretation of this argument is guided by his reading of Quine's correspondence with Alonzo Church in 1943, from the Quine archive, especially the following passage from a letter Quine sent to Church that year:

my attitude toward 'formal' languages is very different from Carnap's. Serious artificial notations, e.g. in mathematics or in your logic or mine, I consider supplementary but integral parts of natural language. . . . Thus it is that I would consider an empirical criterion . . . a solution of the problem of synonymy in general. And thus it is also that . . . I am unmoved by constructions by Carnap in terms of so-called 'semantical rules of a language'. (Quine, letter to Church, quoted on pp. 74-75)

On the basis of this and other similar passages in the Quine-Church correspondence from 1943, Verhaegh argues that it was in 1943 that "Quine for the first time realized why he and Carnap disagreed" (p. 120), namely, that "he, unlike Carnap, demanded a behavioristically acceptable definition of analyticity" (p. 120). What ultimately explains Quine's disagreement with Carnap about analyticity, according to Verhaegh, is that Quine and Carnap have, at root, different conceptions of artificial languages:

Whereas Carnap believes we can simply define a concept by stating rules for its use, Quine argues that a concept is useless if it is not grounded in natural language. Whereas Carnap thinks of artificial languages as mathematical structures, for Quine artificial languages are only intelligible as hypothetical natural languages. (p. 119)

This interpretation makes sense of Quine's critical tone in the passages that Verhaegh cites. It seems to me, however, that in those passages Quine is not rejecting Carnap's conception of artificial languages, but arguing that Carnap's attitude toward artificial languages is unreasonable, given his other commitments. Carnap was confident that the significance of his formal definitions of analyticity could be explained in behavioral terms. He never worked out the details of such explanations, however, and he was not much interested in doing so. It is primarily Carnap's confidence that the significance of his formal definitions of analyticity could be explained in behavioral terms, not Carnap's conception of artificial languages, I suggest, that Quine challenges in the above passage from his letter to Church.

One might think it obvious that Quine takes himself to be rejecting Carnap's conception of formal languages when he writes in the passage quoted above, "Serious artificial notations, e.g. in mathematics or in your logic or mine, I consider supplementary but integral parts of natural language." As I read this sentence, however, it is compatible with Carnap's view of artificial languages, for reasons with which Quine was very familiar. Carnap and Quine agree that as a matter of pragmatic necessity, one needs to use a metalanguage to construct an artificial language. On pain of infinite regress, any such metalanguage must contain an (as yet) unformalized, "natural" part. For these reasons Carnap can agree with Quine that an artificial language is an "integral part" of the natural (unformalized) metalanguage that one uses to define it. Quine highlights the pragmatic dependence of an artificial language on a natural one, and Carnap typically does not. By highlighting this dependence, however, Quine does not thereby reject Carnap's conception of artificial languages.

In 1950, when Quine wrote "Two Dogmas of Empiricism," he concluded that there is no hope for explaining the significance of Carnap's formal definitions of analyticity. This conclusion challenges not only Carnap's attitude toward formal languages, but also Carnap's conception of formal languages, or, more precisely, Carnap's understanding of what can be defined in a formal language. But Quine had not yet taken this step in 1943, when he still hoped to clarify the notion of analyticity in behavioral terms.

Example 2: Sense data and experience

A centerpiece of Verhaegh's developmental story is that it was in 1952 that Quine "became convinced that the very idea of a sense datum language is not epistemologically prior to but dependent upon our best scientific theories of the world -- that '[s]ense data are posits too'" (p. 28). (The quote within this passage is taken from "Posits and Reality," Quine 1952, henceforth PR.) In earlier work, Verhaegh argues, Quine "still believed there might be epistemological reasons for adopting a phenomenalistic conceptual scheme" (p. 27). Even in "Two Dogmas of Empiricism," according to Verhaegh, Quine "appears to presuppose a holistic variant of epistemological phenomenalism [on which] . . . there are pure uninterpreted sense data and there is a conceptual scheme which is to account for those raw experiences as simply and as effectively as possible" (p. 99). Verhaegh cites several unpublished notes from the Quine archive, many as late as 1951, in which Quine describes sense data as epistemologically "fundamental" and emphasizes from an epistemological point of view, "everything is a posit except the flux of raw experience" (p. 99, footnote 47). He argues that it was not until Quine became convinced, as he first announced in his 1952 paper "Posits and Reality," that sense data are themselves posits of our conceptual scheme, that Quine freed himself from his earlier "phenomenalistic" conception of epistemology.

This argument does not fit well with the fact, emphasized above, that Quine started his career as a disciple of Carnap, and endorsed throughout his career the method of working from within science to clarify and improve it. If Quine was committed at the start of his career to working from within Carnap's philosophy and to departing from it only as scientific method itself requires, it is difficult to see how he could arrive at a point in the 1940s when he began conceiving of sense data, or of anything else, as prior to or independent of science.

The text of "Posits and Reality" itself also strongly suggests that when Quine notes that "sense data are posits too," he is not retracting a conception of sense data he previously held. When he writes, "sense data are posits too," he is drawing consequences from a more fundamental point he makes earlier in the article. This point comes in response to the line of reasoning, traced early in the article, that leads to the absurd conclusion that "In whatever sense the molecules in my desk are unreal and a figment of the imagination of the scientist, in that sense the desk itself is unreal and a figment of the imagination of the race" (PR, p. 250). Immediately after stating this absurd conclusion, Quine remarks that "Surely now we have been caught up in a wrong line of reasoning. Not only is the conclusion bizarre; it vitiates the very considerations that lead to it . . . " (PR, p. 250). Quine recommends that we avoid the bizarre conclusion by rethinking the relationship between our theories and our evidence for them:

Having noted that man has no evidence for the existence of bodies beyond the fact that their assumption helps him organize experience, we should have done well, instead of disclaiming evidence for the existence of bodies, to conclude: such, then, at bottom, is what evidence is, both for ordinary bodies and for molecules. (PR, p. 251)

In the next paragraph Quine writes

This point about evidence does not upset the evidential priority of sense data. On the contrary, the point about evidence is precisely that the testimony of the senses does (contrary to Berkeley's notion) count as evidence for bodies, such being (as Samuel Johnson perceived) just the sort of thing that evidence is . . . . The moral to draw from our reconsideration of the terms 'reality' and 'evidence' is that posits are not ipso facto unreal. (PR, p. 251)

On my reading, this moral -- "posits are not ipso facto unreal" -- is the central theme of "Posits and Reality". (The same moral shows up in Word and Object, §6, summarized in Quine's pithy remark, "To call a posit a posit is not to patronize it.") When Quine writes, "Sense data are posits too," he is applying this moral. Thus, immediately after writing, "Sense data are posits too," Quine writes, "They are posits of psychological theory, but not, on that account, unreal" (PR, p. 252, my emphasis). Quine then offers the following rough characterization of the relation between such posits and impacts at a subject's nerve endings: "The sense datum may be construed as a hypothetical component of subjective experience standing in closest possible correspondence to the experimentally measurable conditions of physical stimulation of the end organs" (PR, p. 252, my emphasis). This clarificatory characterization of sense data might well have been offered by Carnap. It is best viewed, I think, as continuous with the scientific conceptions of sense data, and of sensory experience more generally, that Quine inherited from Carnap, and refined throughout his career.

Quine's remarks about the evidential fundamentality of sense data in "Posits and Reality" are also essentially unchanged from earlier remarks that Verhaegh quotes in support of his thesis that Quine had a "phenomenalistic" conception of epistemology prior to "Posits and Reality". Quine writes, for instance,

Sense data, if they are to be posited at all, are . . . evidentially fundamental: every man is beholden to his senses for every hint of body. The physical particles are naturally fundamental, in this kind of way: laws of behavior of those particles afford, so far as we know, the simplest formulation of a general theory of what happens. Common-sense bodies, finally, are conceptually fundamental: it is by reference to them that the very notions of reality and evidence are acquired . . . (PR, p. 252)

What Quine says here about sense data is not essentially different, I think, from what he writes in the following passage from a 1951 letter to James B. Conant that Verhaegh quotes in support of his thesis that in 1951 Quine had not yet come to see that sense data are posits:

The philosopher who epistemologizes backward to sense data . . . is fashioning a conceptual scheme just as the physicist does; but a different one, for a different subject. He agrees that there are electrons and tables and chairs and other people, and that the electrons and other elementary particles are 'fundamental' in the physical sense. . . . But sense data are 'fundamental' in the epistemological sense" (p. 99, no 46).

Finally, the last two quoted passages seem to me to be of a piece with the following well-known passage in "Two Dogmas of Empiricism," §6:

As an empiricist I continue to think of the conceptual scheme of science as a tool, ultimately, for predicting future experience in the light of past experience. Physical objects are conceptually imported into the situation as convenient intermediaries -- not by definition in terms of experience, but simply as irreducible posits comparable, epistemologically, to the gods of Homer. Let me interject that for my part I do, qua lay physicist, believe in physical objects and not in Homer's gods; and I consider it a scientific error to believe otherwise. But in point of epistemological footing the physical objects and the gods differ only in degree and not in kind. Both sorts of entities enter our conception only as cultural posits. The myth of physical objects is epistemologically superior to most in that it has proved more efficacious than other myths as a device for working a manageable structure into the flux of experience.

In short, where Verhaegh sees "Posits and Reality" as a major step towards Quine's mature naturalism, one that rejects, for the first time in Quine's career, the assumption that sense data may be conceived independently of our best scientific theories, I see it a smaller step, a step that clarifies his commitment -- one that he had previously expressed, though less clearly, in "Two Dogmas" -- to the reality of the posits of our best current theories (e.g. physics).

Example 3: The distinction between philosophy and science

A central theme of the book is that "it was Quine, in the late 1940s and early 1950s, who contributed most to the decline of this distinction [between philosophy and science], arguing that it is impossible to draw a strict distinction between matters of fact and matters of language -- between analytic and synthetic" (p. 6). It is well known that Quine taught many mainstream analytic philosophers, among them Carl Hempel, Hilary Putnam, Donald Davidson, and Gilbert Harman, to doubt that there is an epistemologically significant analytic-synthetic distinction and to question the traditional epistemological distinction between what can be known a priori and what can only be known a posteriori. The question of whether there is a distinction between science and philosophy looks very different, however, when one asks it in the context of an account of how Quine's mature philosophy developed from his starting point as a disciple of Carnap. For it was mainly from Carnap, as I suggested above, that Quine inherited the over-arching methodological goal of describing scientific inquiry in purely scientific terms. In particular, Carnap regards formal, or pure semantics, in which he proposed to clarify meanings, as part of the science of logic, and empirical applications of distinctions defined in pure semantics as part of empirical linguistics. In my view, Quine's revolutionary innovation is to argue that the relationships between theoretical sentences and sensory evidence that Carnap sought to reconstruct in his logic of science are better investigated in psychological, not logical, terms. Quine's new form of naturalism appears to be more unified and thorough than Carnap's because it does not draw sharp boundaries between questions of meaning and questions of fact. But, as Quine knows, Carnap does not accept a traditional philosophical notion of apriority or rely on any extra-scientific points of view. As I see it, Quine's fundamental criticism of Carnap is that by Carnap's own scientific standards, which Quine takes himself to share with Carnap, Carnap's definitions of analyticity are unclear and should be purged from scientific philosophy.

In sum, on the interpretation I favor, Quine's development is best seen as the result of working from within Carnap's naturalism, finding difficulties with it, and gradually fashioning a new form of naturalism in which Carnap's analytic-synthetic distinction plays no role. A great deal of the book can be read as filling in the details of such a developmental story. Other parts of the book are better read as explaining how Quine's naturalism challenges traditional philosophical views about meaning, apriority, and sense data. Both approaches are essential to a full understanding of Quine's naturalism.

Partly for this reason, but, more generally, because it is filled with concise, sensible, open-minded, and enlightening analyses of writings by and about Quine, including many documents from the Quine archive that have not been discussed before in the secondary literature, I learned a great deal from studying the book. Although I have focused in this review on three parts of the book where I favor readings of Quine's development that are different from the ones Verhaegh presents, there are many more parts of the book -- too many to list comprehensively here -- that I find very convincing. These include: chapter 3, which presents the best general analysis and overview I have yet seen of the similarities and differences between Quine's and Carnap's views on ontology; the insightful suggestion, supported by documents from the Quine archive, that Quine was dissatisfied with "Two Dogmas" for the reason that "if Carnap's epistemology was in need of empirical clarification, so was his own holistic alternative" (p. 98); the argument of §7.5 (mentioned above) that Quine first started using "naturalism" to describe his philosophy in 1968; the illuminating analyses of Quine's global holism in sections 6.3.1 -- 6.3.4; and the decisive argument in the same sections that Quine never abandoned his maximal inclusion version of global holism.

In short, Working from Within is an impressive scholarly and philosophical achievement. Its exemplary use of archival sources to construct a richer, deeper account of the nature and development of Quine's naturalism sets a new standard in Quine scholarship. Everyone who wants to understand Quine's naturalism should read it.


Carnap, Rudolf, 1934, "The Task of the Logic of Science." English translation of a paper originally published in German in 1934. In B. McGuinness (ed.) Unified Science: the Vienna Circle Monographs Series Originally Edited by Otto Neurath (Dordrecht: Reidel, 1987) 46-66.

Quine, W. V., 1952, "Posits and Reality," in S. Uyeda (ed.) The Unity of Knowledge (New York: Doubleday, 1955), pp. 391-400. Reprinted in W.V. Quine, The Ways of Paradox (New York: Random House, 1966), pp. 228-245.

Quine, W. V., 1970, "Homage to Carnap," in Creath, Richard (ed), 1990: Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work (Berkeley: University of California Press), pp. 463-466.