Working Virtue: Virtue Ethics and Contemporary Moral Problems

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Rebecca L. Walker and Philip J. Ivanhoe (eds.), Working Virtue: Virtue Ethics and Contemporary Moral Problems, Oxford University Press, 2007, 319pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 978199271658.

Reviewed by David Carr, University of Edinburgh


As is now familiar, a virtue ethical approach to ethics and moral philosophy, for the most part drawing on Aristotle, was revived around the middle of the last century. As the editors to this new collection of essays on virtue ethics also note, this revival was probably mainly inspired by the British philosopher Elizabeth Anscombe who used virtue ethical ideas mainly as a stick to beat the dominant ethical theories of the day, utilitarianism and (Kantian) deontology. Anscombe's own observations were fairly programmatic and she wrote little on virtue herself; but many philosophers were quick to pursue her pioneering suggestions and over the course of the past half-century, virtue ethics has developed into a potent third force in contemporary ethics and moral philosophy -- and is now commonly regarded as a serious rival to Kantian ethics of duty and utilitarian ethics of utility. It has also, as philosophical theories are apt to do, greatly diversified over the years: there are almost as many approaches to virtue ethics as there are virtue ethicists, and just as much disagreement between them about the ethical character and status of virtue. Elsewhere, I have identified a number of distinct varieties of virtue ethics: these include the mainstream Aristotelian (eudaemonistic) virtue ethics of (apparently) Anscombe, Peter Geach and Philippa Foot; the moral realist virtue ethics of John MacDowell; the idealist or social constructivist account of Alasdair MacIntyre; the 'sentimentalist' (to use the term adopted in this book) approach of Michael Slote; and the 'pluralist' theory of Christine Swanton.

But the theoretical questions raised by these different perspectives have no less significant practical implications -- since it is generally considered by its advocates to be a virtue of virtue ethics that it is directly addressed to down-to-earth developmental issues concerning the cultivation and formation of human character. For Aristotle (criticizing the moral hyper-rationalism of Plato), the acquisition of virtue is a profoundly practical matter and as well showing much interest in the mechanics of character formation, he is also greatly exercised by the significance of such qualities for effective public, civic and political life and participation. It is in this sprit that the editors have brought together thirteen essays by scholars working in a variety of professional fields: Nel Noddings on caring in education; Edmund Pelegrino on medical professionalism; Jeffery Blustein on doctoring and self-forgiveness; Jennifer Ralden on professional virtue in psychiatry; Annette Baier on trust in medicine; Rosalind Hursthouse on environmental ethics; Rebecca Walker on ethical treatment of animals; Peter Koller on virtue and law; Christine Swanton on virtue and role ethics in business; Lawrence Blum on race and virtue; Nancy Sherman on anger and virtue in a military context; Michael Slote on virtue and famine; and Philip Ivanhoe on virtue and filial piety (in Confucian thought). All of these essays raise interesting questions and issues; however, I shall not attempt to address them all in the space of this short review.

Further to this, indeed, the editors mildly complain that the practical implications of virtue ethics have been hitherto rather neglected in the literature. In the event, however, there is rather more in this field than the editors (and contributors) acknowledge or have recognised. For a start, substantial work has been done in educational philosophy by a number of orthodox virtue ethicists and a major collection of essays on virtue ethics and education (containing essays by some of the contributors to this volume, and favourably reviewed by another) appeared a few years ago under the editorship of this reviewer and an Amsterdam colleague (Carr and Steutel 1999). Again, there has been a fair amount of virtue ethical work on professional and other wider public and social issues: Raja Halwani's recent collection on sex and ethics (2007), for example, explicitly sets out to address sexual morality from a virtue ethical and/or theoretical direction. All the same, the appearance of additional work in this general field might well be welcomed. That said, in so far as the stated aim of this collection is to show how public and professional issues might be usefully addressed from a distinctively virtue ethical -- as opposed to a deontological or utilitarian -- perspective, it may yet be asked how well it succeeds in doing so. In relation to this question, it may first be noted that the editorial introduction devotes some attention to a common distinction between virtue theory and virtue ethics. According to this distinction, in so far as any and all discussions of virtue might fall under the rubric of virtue theory, virtue theory has a wider scope than virtue ethics. For whereas Kantian and utilitarian accounts which regard the development or cultivation of virtues as of some (motivational) moral importance would count as theories of virtue, they are yet not virtue ethical accounts in so far as they do not -- unlike (allegedly) Aristotle's view -- give ethical primacy to the cultivation of dispositional (aretaic) qualities over (deontic) principles.

To be sure, as with most such philosophical distinctions, things are not quite so clear cut and there are cases where we might be hard put to know whether a particular account was virtue ethical or not: but there is enough broad direction here to rule out certain accounts as virtue ethical, since some (Kant's or Mill's say) would define a virtue in terms of obedience to independently established ethical principles rather than understanding qualities of character as somehow (virtue ethically) prior to any and all determinations of such principles. However, while the editors of this volume clearly see this distinction as significant for the general direction of this collection, they are not at all resolute in maintaining it: on the one hand, they recognise the difficulty of strictly observing any such distinction, but on the other they are also emphatic that 'not anything goes' in virtue ethics. But such apparent indecision about whether or not it matters whether a theory is virtue ethical arguably creates something of a dilemma here: either the distinction does matter for the distinctive identity of the collection, in which case accounts of virtue from other ethical perspectives would need to be ruled out as lacking the relevant virtue ethical character; or it doesn't matter, in which case this may be little more than a general collection of essays on practical ethics under a somewhat misleading trades description. In the event, it seems to me that this collection is significantly caught on the second horn of this dilemma: it is not an especially virtue ethics-focused collection, a significant proportion of the contributors are not virtue ethicists, and one rather suspects -- given the rather loose grasp that some contributors seem to have on the idea of a virtue as such -- that some of them do not have much real interest in virtues at all.

Indeed, there can hardly be a better case in point here than the leading article by Nel Noddings. Noddings is a highly regarded writer on ethics and education, but she is not a virtue ethicist -- and (whatever she has chosen to say here) she has previously opposed any virtue ethical interpretation of her favoured topic of care in debate with virtue ethicists such as Michael Slote. The main direction from which she has been influenced would seem to be Hume rather than Aristotle, and it is revealing that she apparently thinks (p. 59) that virtue ethics sides with care ethics in rejecting moral principles (when it is quite clear that the great champions of virtue ethics from Aristotle through Aquinas to (say) Geach and MacIntyre take various kinds of (fixed and other) principles very seriously indeed). As she has repeatedly argued, her care ethics is focused primarily on the quality of human relationships and association (and of institutions) rather than upon the development of individual dispositions, and she is not much (at least ethically) concerned -- as much mainstream virtue ethics is -- with goals of individual development and perfection. From this viewpoint, on the assumption that this volume is about the public and professional significance of virtue ethics, it may be said that there are several educational philosophers of international reputation who might have better served to show how key virtue ethical concepts might be given distinctive and significant application to education and teaching. It is also clear (as the editors admit) that other contributions to this volume -- irrespective of any other merits -- either do not take a virtue ethical perspective (such as Peter Koller on law and morality), or have only tenuous or tangential connections to virtue ethics.

To be sure, while such departures from the avowed editorial intent of this volume may well disappoint the expectations of some readers, it does not detract from the overall high academic and professional standard of the contributions to this volume -- most of which are well turned and have something of general applied ethical significance to say. Moreover, a proportion of the essays do seem to be fairly on professed editorial target. Indeed, despite the fact that her virtue ethical connections are not exactly impeccable (given her well known Kantian leanings), Nancy Sherman's insightful exploration of the place of anger in (specifically military) virtue meets the general aims of this volume about as well as could be wished. As might also be expected, some of the key figures of contemporary virtue ethics who are represented in the volume -- perhaps particularly Hursthouse, Slote and Swanton -- also offer relevant chapters that do engage directly with aspects of the distinctive contribution of virtue ethics to problems of applied and professional ethics. That said, some of these and other essays in this collection also raise -- in what also seem to me fairly problematic ways -- at least two crucial issues about how virtue could or should be understood in contexts of applied ethics.

The first of these is an issue of some potential conceptual inflation involved in the idea of suggesting or inventing 'new' virtues. One place in which this issue arises is in Hursthouse's essay in which, for various reasons, she suggests the development of a new virtue of respect for nature. (This suggestion is also connected in various ways with her apparent rejection of eudaimonistic foundations for virtue -- which also seems to me mistaken: the fact that we do not use eudaimonistic reasons to dissuade children from being cruel to animals does not invalidate the Aristotelian appeal to human flourishing to explain why -- at another more theoretical level -- we value virtue.)  But Hursthouse's new virtue is also supplemented in this work by (at least) Blustein's self-forgiveness and Blum's respect for blackness. To cut a long story short, however, I think that all of these 'new' virtues involve some confusion between virtues as such and particular problems or topics to which (old) virtues may be addressed. There may perhaps be Aristotelian excesses and defects in taking a person's racial background into account in some contexts, but the virtue that gets it right is not respecting blackness, but justice. Indeed, in so far as Blum's 'respecting blackness' is not something we should always morally expect, even in the presence of blackness, there would seem to be not just confusion but also some dangerous absurdity in regarding it as a virtue.

The second (not unrelated) problematic issue raised in several places in this work concerns the relationship between the familiar virtues of ordinary human moral association and so-called virtues of 'role' -- specifically required in this or that professional or vocational context -- that may sometimes appear to conflict with ordinary moral virtues. This problem is brought into sharp relief by the examples of some contributors (for instance, by Radden's suggestion that psychiatrists may be drawn to 'feign virtue' as a means to helping the recovery of patients) and it is directly addressed by Christine Swanton, who argues that role virtues are nevertheless reconcilable with 'prototype' virtues, in so far as the former are in the last resort accountable to the standards of the latter. Once again, despite the ingenuity of Swanton's case, one may doubt whether this is the right thing to say. Clearly, there are conflicts between prototype virtues and what a particular professional role requires as right conduct. It is professionally right for soldiers to obey orders without question (at any rate in the heat of battle), which means that it may -- from a military standpoint -- be professionally right to kill people or endanger the lives of civilians; but it is hardly virtuous to do so. So, while one might well wish (along with Swanton) to bring business or other professional practice more in line with 'regular' virtue, it might be a better move here simply to deny that role virtues are virtues in anything other than some secondary or derivative sense. Once more, the problem may be that regarding the standards required for the successful prosecution of this or that professional role as expressive of genuine virtue is just unnecessarily and unhelpfully inflationary. In the context of education and teaching, it is professionally desirable that teachers should behave honestly, fairly and with self-control; but the best sort of teacher is arguably not the one who feigns honesty, fairness and self-control but the one who actually is honest, fair and self-controlled. From the virtue ethical viewpoint, the aim of professional ethics should be to produce virtuous teachers rather than practitioners of 'role virtues'.

While space precludes further detailed comment on individual contributions to this collection, this should not be taken to imply that any essays not mentioned are of little or no interest. On the contrary, there is work here of potential interest to a range of professional and public fields of concern. As already indicated, however, I would not regard this volume as a particularly well-focused or coherent collection of essays on the practical application of virtue ethics as such. Indeed, I am inclined to wonder whether a newcomer to virtue ethics would get a very good sense from this volume of the distinctive character and basic themes of virtue ethics -- and, from this viewpoint, the editors might have better devoted the space given to résumés of contributors' essays to some more detailed stage-setting of the basic form, themes and wider literature of (Aristotelian and/or other) virtue ethics. However, as a general collection of contemporary work on applied ethics -- or even perhaps of virtue theory -- the collection fares rather better, and contains much of respectable quality and of general interest to scholars working in a fair range of applied ethical fields.


Carr, D. and Steutel, J. (eds) (1999) Virtue Ethics and Moral Education, London: Routledge.

Halwani, R. (ed) (2007) Sex and Ethics: Essays on Sexuality, Virtue and the Good Life, Basingstoke and New York: Palgrave Macmillan.