Works of Music: An Essay in Ontology

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Julian Dodd, Works of Music: An Essay in Ontology, Oxford University Press, 2007, 286pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199284375.

Reviewed by Franklin Bruno, Bard College


Some ontologists of music are drawn to the subfield primarily by aesthetic concerns; others, by metaphysical ones.  Julian Dodd falls into the latter camp.  To note this is to echo his avowed motivation of "returning the ontology of art to its rightful place at the core of the analytical metaphysical tradition" (4), a project he takes to be shared by, among others, Jerrold Levinson, Nicholas Wolterstorff, and Gregory Currie.  It is also to alert potential readers to the style of argumentation to be expected, and the degree to which highly abstract considerations are taken to constrain an account of our musical practices.  It is not, however, to denigrate Dodd's approach, nor to diminish the care and subtlety with which he pursues it.  It would be unfair to the authors named above to say that Works of Music sets a new standard in these respects, but it certainly meets any reasonable conception of such a standard.  The fact that substantive criticisms can be raised against Dodd's position is a measure of its clarity.

Dodd distinguishes two key questions about the ontology of music: the categorical question (what sort of entity is a work of music?) and the individuation question (how are works identified and distinguished?).  His position, styled "The Simple View" (3), comprises an answer to each.  As to the categorical question, works are sound-event-types, the tokens or occurrences of which are their performances.  Seven of the book's nine chapters elaborate and defend this type-token account.  Requiring that an ontology of music account for works' repeatability (the same work can have distinct occurrences [9]) and their audibility (works are the sort of things that can be heard [11]), Dodd begins by arguing that the type-token account explains these features better than nominalism or idealism, its traditional rivals.  Chapters 2 and 3 specify Dodd's conception of types as ontologically "unstructured" (48), unchanging, and eternal.  Chapters 4 and 5, respectively, defend the identification of musical works with such types against the charge that it falls foul of works' temporal and modal flexibility, and against the objection that works do not exist eternally, being brought into being by their composers.  Chapters 6 and 7 criticize recent, sophisticated rivals: Guy Rohrbaugh's "historical continuant" account, and the action-based accounts proposed by Gregory Currie and David Davies.

The final two chapters take up the individuation question.  Dodd's "sonicism" (2) holds that "work-identity consists in acoustic indistinguishability" (8).  Sonicism is explicitly directed against the recently influential "contextualism" about individuation associated with Jerrold Levinson, on which various properties not readily described in acoustic terms are also essential to work-identity.  Sonicism has aesthetic and epistemological implications, as well as metaphysical ones.  I return to sonicism below, after a discussion of some aspects of the type-token account.  It should be noted, however, that the two components of The Simple View are more closely entwined than the book's surface organization suggests.

Dodd's discussion of types is a substantial contribution.  Applications to music aside, it may profitably be read as a short independent treatise in "first philosophy."  For Dodd, types are individuated by reference to "the condition that something must meet in order to be one of its tokens" (40).  Such a condition can be understood in terms of the properties something must have in order to be a token of a given type.  The details of this view draw liberally, though not uncritically, on Wolterstorff's Worlds and Works of Art (Oxford, 1980).  The truth of such sentences as "The Polar Bear is a mammal," despite the fact that no abstract entity can itself be a mammal, is explained by Wolterstorff's doctrine of "analogical predication" (46), on which the property that the type Polar Bear literally possesses is that of being such that for some particular x to be one of its tokens, x must be a mammal.  "The Polar Bear is a mammal" is a way of predicating just that property of the type in question.  Dodd also recognizes the existence of norm-types (which Wolterstorff called "norm-kinds" [32, n. 19]): types such that certain properties associated with them must be possessed by a putative token in order for it to be a "correctly formed token" (32) thereof.  This allows for tokens that lack some properties associated with the relevant type; a three-legged polar bear is still a token of the type Polar Bear.  (I will not spell out the application to imperfect performances of a piece of music here.)

Dodd is less concerned with convincing the dyed-in-the-wool nominalist, with her "hostility towards abstracta" (40), that types are part of the "fabric of the world" (33) than with defending his conception of types as eternal and unchanging against rival conceptions on which a type exists only when it is instantiated, or only when it can be instantiated.  This defense rests in turn on accepting that properties exist eternally.  Dodd usefully distinguishes between questions about when properties such as being a son of Lincoln can be instantiated, and questions about whether such properties exist when they cannot be instantiated.  Dodd argues that, although no particular entity can be a son of Lincoln before a certain point in time, and that the question of whether something is a son of Lincoln "could not have arisen for anyone before Lincoln's birth" (72), the condition something must meet to be a son of Lincoln is nonetheless the same in 1066 as in 1845.  If a property is "nothing but a condition" (74) that some individuals meet while others do not, properties themselves exist at all times, whether or not they are or can be instantiated at a given time.  Much the same conclusion would seem to follow about types themselves, given their individuation in terms of associated properties.

The ontologist who identifies musical works with eternal, unchanging types must embrace the consequence that musical works cannot be created.  In accepting and defending this "musical Platonism," Dodd parts from Wolterstorff and other type-theorists who attempt to avoid it (100-106).  Much ordinary practice, however, treats a work's composer as its creator, and for some philosophers, the creatability of artworks is a datum, on a par with repeatability and audibility.  For Dodd this is "a folk theory about the nature of composition" (114), which neither linguistic evidence nor the phenomenology of compositional activity forces on us.  This point is compelling: our talk of "creativity" regarding composers' relation to their work need not be understood in terms of bringing entities into being where there were none.  Dodd argues that an understanding of composition as "creative discovery" (112) better explains the undeniable creativity of such activity, and does so in a manner compatible with his preferred ontology.  An admittedly imperfect analogy is drawn between a composer's selection of a sound-event-type, which is already "there" to be found, and the discovery of a mathematical proof or a scientific theory.  Some details here are worrisome: the characterization of composition on which, "in imagining various endings for the work, Bach probably considered numerous descriptive sound-event-types" (112) before selecting one, sits oddly with an earlier skepticism toward "an ontology of mental tunes" (28).  Also, the form of scientific realism implied by the conception of theory-construction in the sciences as involving "discoveries of facts" (118) is a bit raw.  Nonetheless, Dodd does much to make "creative discovery" digestible, though those committed to works' creatability may insist that a bullet has been bitten.

Dodd's attempt to preserve the audibility of musical works fares less well.  This theme runs throughout the book: the objection that a given account does not allow for a work to be heard (or "heard in toto" [92]) by hearing one of its performances is explicitly raised against the identification of works with sets (18), a Goodmanian nominalism (21), idealism about works (26), at least one rival conception of types (92), the "perdurantist" version of the "historical continuant" view (157), and David Davies' "Performance Theory" (183).  It is not clear that the type-token theory succeeds where all these fail.  Without question, our practical criterion for saying that someone has heard a work is that she has heard it performed.  Dodd commits himself to the stronger thesis that "works of music are things that we can listen to"(12) or hear.  He recognizes that if works, being abstracta, lack a spatio-temporal location, the claim that we are in perceptual contact with just those entities requires further argument.  Dodd proposes that "[a] work of music … can enter into causal [and hence perceptual] relations derivatively by virtue of being a type of sound-event: a type whose token events can feature as relata of causal relations" (16).  To say that a work can be heard is just to say that its tokens can (in a more ordinary sense) be heard.  This proposal runs parallel to one about how it is that "sticks, stones, and people," as opposed to the sounds they make, can be heard: "[W]hen a type/token theorist applies 'is audible' to a work of music, the predicate expresses the same sense as it does when it is applied to material objects" (94).

Here, one wonders why rival accounts are not allowed recourse to similar proposals.  Why, for example, is the advocate of the "historical continuant" theory barred from proposing that what it means to say that one "hears a work" when one hears one of its performances is that one has heard one of its parts?  There are other cases in which what it means to say that one has perceived something is that one has perceived one of its spatial or temporal parts; think of the satisfaction conditions of "seeing a river" or "seeing a parade."  Given that Dodd exploits what amounts to an ambiguity in the verb "to hear," his opponents may do so as well.  Moreover, Dodd's contention that "it is surely a datum that works of music are things that we can listen to" (12) is dubious.  What are data are that we have some sort of cognitive access to works, and that our auditory perception of performances is a well-traveled avenue to that access.  These facts hardly show that works themselves are objects of audition.  One might instead explicate the kind of cognitive access we have to works -- which we conventionally describe in terms of our "hearing" them -- in some other way.  In forgoing this option, Dodd sets the bar too high for both himself and his opponents.

More generally, it is often unclear how Dodd arrives at judgments concerning which aspects of practice, especially as reflected in ordinary language, an ontology of music must preserve.  On the one hand, an important prima facie advantage of the type-token account over nominalism is that the former does not require extensive paraphrase of ordinary assertions that appear to quantify over musical works (22-24); here, our ordinary-language commitments are respected.  On similar grounds, Dodd claims that "[a]n ontological proposal that had as a consequence" that works are not heard "should only be adopted in extremis" (13).  On the other hand, the account of "creative discovery" described above explains apparently ordinary commitments as folk-theory with no purchase on serious theorizing.  So also for Dodd's reinterpretation of our everyday notion that composers' change and revise their works.  Given that types (and thus works) are incapable of change over time, "this process can only be one in which a composer progressively composes different, but related items until … he takes himself to be finished" (91).  For that matter, the doctrine of analogical predication is itself revisionary, in claiming that predicates have distinct but systematically related meanings, depending on whether they are applied to types or tokens.  Make no mistake: Dodd's stances on specific questions of this sort are consistent and ingeniously argued, but to the extent that practices that fall easily in line with the type-token theory are taken to support that theory, while those that do not "can be explained away" (56), Dodd's argumentation can seem arbitrary and rhetorical.  Some explicit methodological or metaphilosophical discussion might have countered this impression.[1]

We are now better placed to assess Dodd's "sonicism."  One explicit and revealing characterization of this view runs:

Whether a sound-event counts as a properly formed token of [norm-type] W is determined by its acoustic qualitative appearance.  Nothing else matters.  The properties comprising the set ∑ of properties normative within any work W are all wholly acoustic in character: properties such as being in 4/4 time, ending with a C minor chord, and so on. (210)

Dodd later makes clear that these normative and hence work-individuating properties include tonal or acoustic properties that are not readily characterized in terms of a work's melodic, harmonic or rhythmic structure.  It is this "timbral sonicism" (212) that Dodd defends.

By contrast, the "nothing else" in the above passage covers much that might be thought relevant to a work's identity: properties concerning the means by which composers indicate that the sounds making up a performance of a work are to be produced (that is, their instrumental properties); the identity of the composer and time of composition (or, alternately, the musico-historical context of the work's composition); many, though not all, expressive properties, all representational properties, and putative "artistic" properties such as a work's being original, derivative, or "Lizst-influenced" (257).

Much of the case for timbral sonicism rests on "aesthetic empiricism" (186; the term originates with Gregory Currie) about the understanding and appreciation of music.  This is "the view that to appreciate a piece of music, we need only use our ears.  The limits of musical appreciation, the empiricist claims, are what can be heard in the work, or derived from listening to it" (205).  To call things by their names: aesthetic empiricism is a variety of formalism, with overtones of Hanslick and (on some interpretations) Kant.  Under pressure from well-known arguments of Kendall Walton's, however, Dodd accepts that facts about the "category" into which a given work falls are also relevant to appreciation.  In this respect, he characterizes his empiricism as moderate (215).  Here, there is an unremarked difficulty, in that it is not clear that the type-theorist can allow Waltonian categories to be properties of works.  The idea that such properties as being a sonata or being a showtune are genuinely possessed by works in virtue of the properties of their tokens is not readily understood on the model of analogical predication.

This aside, it is disappointing that the argument for sonicism depends so heavily on the above conception of musical understanding and value.  Contextualists about individuation, such as Levenson and Stephen Davies, are driven to that view precisely because they hope to answer ontological questions in a way compatible with the thought, increasingly compelling across the arts, that formalism is insufficiently rich to explain artistic experience and value.  Absent this motivation, or a sympathetic recognition of its pull, the denial of contextualism is fait accompli, and may leave the reader feeling that the most serious challenge to sonicism has merely been dodged.  (To put this differently: An attempt to show that a relatively austere answer to the "individuation question" could be made to fit with a richer epistemology of musical value might have been more edifying, even if unsuccessful.)

This would be irrelevant if Dodd's case for aesthetic empiricism were independently compelling.  Unfortunately, the appeal to what can be "heard in the work" by the exclusive use of "our ears" raises more questions than it settles.  Dodd allows that the possession of certain kinds of discriminatory capacity, such as the ability to recognize the music-theoretical properties of what one hears, "enable[s] us to hear more in a work than we do otherwise" (208).  Similar comments apply to the relevance of categorical knowledge.  But if the kind of "hearing" relevant to musical experience is cognitively penetrable in these ways, it is not at all clear why it should be impenetrable to contextual knowledge of other kinds, nor is it evident how and where the line between the music-theoretical and the merely art-historical should be drawn.

A closely related difficulty concerns the way in which listeners come to possess the "maximally developed discriminative abilities, discernment, and sensitivity" (270) required for full musical understanding.  To appreciate Miles Davis' Kind of Blue, Dodd claims, "one must be able to distinguish jazz based on scales from chords-based jazz"(268).  While contextual knowledge of Davis' previous work and musical influences might contingently help one acquire this ability, such knowledge is not necessary; the ability to make the relevant musical distinctions could be gained just on the basis of listening to enough similar and dissimilar music -- with, let us be clear, no guidance whatever about the progression of jazz styles or any other merely art-historical information.

The latter claim is implausible by Dodd's own lights, in that he can hardly argue that being a modal rather than a chordal improvisation is a property of how Davis' work sounds.  After all, a piece of music sonically indistinguishable from Kind of Blue could also be a chordal improvisation (with significantly less harmonic motion than, say, a bebop performance), a free improvisation, or a perfectly realized performance of a fully-notated score.  If this is true (and possibly even if it is false), the fact that Kind of Blue is "the summation of the development of modal jazz" (268) could not be inferred merely from a conceptually- and historically-"deaf" comparison with other performances (and, in this example, recordings).  Similar concerns can be raised about the purely auditory status of such music-theoretical properties as ending with a C chord or being in 4/4 time.  Once this difficulty about which properties of music can be "heard" through "our ears" alone is recognized, intermittent bouts of table-thumping as to what it is to hear or appreciate music "as music" (205, 267, 270; italics Dodd's) are unpersuasive.

Dodd might instead have claimed that properties like being a modally-based improvisation (or, perhaps more plausibly, being jazz) are among the categorical properties the moderate empiricist recognizes.  He does not make this move, perhaps because it would make Waltonian categories do an unspecified amount of work, or because of the problem, already noted, of the status of such properties on the type-token account.  (I hope it is clear that there is nothing peculiar to jazz in any of this.)

Dodd's critique of ontological proposals accompanying contextualism is judicious; he rejects several previous objections to Levinson's indicated-type proposal as insufficient or indecisive (246-249, 253-256).  Dodd's own "mixed strategy" (253) against contextualism divides the putatively non-acoustic properties alleged to be relevant to work-identity into two categories.  The first includes "artistic," "representational," and "object-directed expressive" properties (256).  In all these cases, Dodd denies that works genuinely possess such properties; a fortiori, works are not individuated by them.  To mention one difficulty: the argument that works have no representational properties leans on a view of Scruton's, to the effect that (i) all genuine cases of representation are propositional in character and (ii) music cannot represent propositions.  Dodd recognizes that the response that music we would normally say sounds like church-bells represents the demonstrative proposition <here are some church-bells> is unsatisfactory.  But (i) need not be accepted: Scruton's denial that some forms of representation are merely referential or denotative is merely stipulative.

Turning to those expressive properties that we can deny of music only on pain of massively sweeping revisionism, as well as some allegedly aesthetic properties, Dodd directly denies, against Levinson's well-known arguments from twin cases, that works W and W*, identical with respect to the sonic properties essential and normative within them, may nonetheless differ with respect to these properties.  If Schoenberg's Pierrot Lunaire (PL) genuinely possesses some aesthetic property, then a sonic doppelganger (PL*) must as well, even if it is by another composer working in a different musico-historical context, with entirely different influences and artistic concerns.  For some putative aesthetic properties (such as a work's being original or derivative), Dodd's actual strategy is still one of denial; for him, these are merely art-historical properties of the composer's achievement, and thus not properties possessed or lacked by either work.  This strategy derives directly from the type-token account, and inherits its strengths and weaknesses.  In fact, at some points it seems that the argument amounts to this: Contextualism claims that a work can have property P.  But P cannot be a property of the work on the type-token view.  The type-token view is correct.  Therefore contextualism is false. (257)  This strategy is legitimate, if not independently convincing; however, it tells against contextualist ontological proposals rather than contextualism itself, which more directly concerns matters of epistemology and evaluation.

For other cases (such as PL's being bizarre or disturbing), Dodd mounts the following argument: If one work is correctly heard as possessing such a property, the contextualist must claim that it is a "perceptual error" (273) to fail to ascribe it to PL* as well.  But no such error can be located, given that, by hypothesis, the two works are sonically indistinguishable.  Thus both works possess the relevant property, or neither does.  This is a genuinely challenging argument, in two respects.  First, it lays bare the characteristic but confusing contextualist claim that "two aurally indistinguishable sounds might … sound different to a hearer if they are heard against different backgrounds of information" (271).  Though these are Dodd's words, they are not an unfair paraphrase of claims made by Levinson, and these surely require more explication.  Second, it highlights the strategic difficulty that the contextualist has in isolating properties that are neither "purely musical" nor supervenient on those that are, but that a formalist opponent will deem "aesthetic."  That said, the sonicist has a related problem, already noted: Dodd's appeal to "perceptual error" again raises the question of the degree to which what is "heard," in the sense relevant to musical experience, is colored by what is known.  The underlying issue here is genuinely one of aesthetics, in a venerable sense of that term.  As such, it is unlikely to be decided on metaphysical grounds.

Despite the length of this review, I have not touched on Dodd's treatment of several important issues.  I have omitted discussion of his defense of the modal (as opposed to temporal) flexibility of types and works, and of his carefully argued criticisms of the rival accounts produced by Rohrbaugh, Currie, and David Davies.  There is no question that Works of Music is required reading for anyone concerned with the current state of the ontology of art; it also deserves a more general readership among metaphysicians.  Few will deny that Dodd has produced a cohesive and ingeniously-defended account of a certain class of entities.  As to whether that class includes those items advertised in the book's title, there will be considerably more debate.

[1] At a recent "Author Meets Critics" session on the book under review (American Society of Aesthetics National Meeting, Los Angeles, November 2007), much of the discussion focused on methodological issues, with session chair Amie Thommason and commentators Andrew Kania, James Young, and Lee F. Brown pressing points similar to those made here.  I should note that my own attendance at this session was of assistance in preparing the present review, as were related conversations during the conference with Julian Dodd and Guy Rohrbaugh.