World Crisis and Underdevelopment: A Critical Theory of Poverty, Agency, and Coercion

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David Ingram, World Crisis and Underdevelopment: A Critical Theory of Poverty, Agency, and Coercion, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 376pp., $120.00, ISBN 9781108421812.

Reviewed by Julian Culp, Goethe-Universität Frankfurt


David Ingram offers an empirically rich and normatively subtle discussion of an array of political issues pertaining to globalization. The issues that Ingram addresses in a transdisciplinary manner include global development policy, migration, international trade, human rights and cosmopolitan solidarity. Ingram adopts a critical-theoretical approach that is historically situated and aims at illuminating the ongoing social struggles of our age. Because of the complexity of the struggles that are connected to globalization, this is, indeed, a bold endeavor. Ingram nevertheless succeeds in this project by way of a veritable tour de force through vast tracts of the contemporary economic, legal, political and public policy-related research on globalization.

The normative lens through which Ingram critically analyzes the social-scientific research on globalization is shaped, above all, by insights of Jürgen Habermas' discourse theory of morality, law and politics. Thus, Ingram calls for properly structured deliberations about and within the normative orders around which current social struggles center. In addition, he adopts core ideas of Axel Honneth's theory of recognition and argues that relations of mutual recognition are necessary for individuals to develop the kind of agency that is required not only for such discursive engagement but also for the formation of an intact personal identity. On the basis of this normative framework, Ingram argues, more specifically, in favor of participatory methods in poverty research (Chapter 2), integrating court hearings of refugees into migration law (Chapter 3), a democratic socialist arrangement of the global economy (Chapter 4), the recognition of a human right to democracy (Chapter 5), the democratic constitutionalization of the international human rights regime (Chapter 6), and a civic-democratic conception of cosmopolitan solidarity (Chapter 7).

Although the discourse-theoretic claims seem to dominate Ingram's view, at least overall, his recognition-theoretic commitments nevertheless result in substantial qualifications that clearly distinguish his view from that of cosmopolitan democrats such as David Held (1995). For example, Ingram criticizes cosmopolitan arguments for open borders on the ground that they neglect "the cultural uprooting and loss of citizenship rights" (p. 153) that migrants experience when they leave their families and political communities behind. These experiences, argues Ingram, pose a considerable threat to the migrants' personal identity because of "the importance of communal attachments for fostering social recognition and intact identity" (p. 153). Hence, despite the "quasi-cosmopolitan implications" (p. 159) that Ingram draws from his discourse-ethical assumptions, his adoption of the recognition-theoretic perspective leads him to defend as well positions of a communitarian sort.

This recognition-theoretic perspective is grounded in the idea that a disposition for democratic engagement -- and thus democratic agency -- presupposes embodied moral practices (Sittlichkeit) within everyday intimate, economic and political relationships of mutual recognition. Following Honneth's (2014) most recent conceptualization of how such recognition is related to social freedom, Ingram argues that "individuals bound together by love, economic cooperation, and democratic self-determination self-consciously recognize the freedom of the other as a precondition for, rather than limit to, their own freedom" (p. 67). Thereby, Ingram's overall narrative is that the ultimate justification of public policies in areas such as global development, migration, international trade, and human rights demands the democratization of global governance, but that such democratization will not occur if public policies are forgetful of individuals' basic need for various types of social recognition in concrete personal, economic and political relationships.

Given how heavily Ingram relies on the critical theories of Habermas and Honneth, it is rather unsurprising that he develops this particular narrative. Yet what is distinct about this book is the diversity of political issues that Ingram is able to embed within this narrative of democratic justification and mutual recognition. This makes his book not only exciting to read but also politically relevant for a number of pressing issues of global public policy. However, there is also a considerable cost attached to Ingram's critical discussion of an ample array of political issues within a single monograph: he neglects highly pertinent normative literatures, the examination of which could have substantially enriched and solidified the volume.

Beginning with the book's title, it is quite remarkable that Ingram does not at all refer to the works of the Marxist economists Paul Baran (1967) and André Frank (1975), who coined the term underdevelopment. These economists attempt to clarify that several societies' lack of social development is not a mere coincidence, but the result of how the more powerful societies dominate international trade relations. Nevertheless, Ingram fails to track the historical origin of the concept that figures as the title of his study. This is problematic because some of his arguments therefore miss the normative point of the concept of underdevelopment. For example, Ingram maintains that "determining the causes of poverty and economic inequality is not necessary for determining whether poverty is unjust and whether we have duties to remedy it" (p. 25). Yet the very point of those who propagated the idea of underdevelopment was that poverty and inequality are moral calamities precisely because of the fact that their causes are human-made rather than the consequence of mere chance.

In addition, Ingram takes little note of the literatures in development ethics, although they are highly relevant for his concerns with democratic agency and participatory methods in poverty research. For example, David Crocker (2008) employs a Sen-inspired concept of democratic agency as the fundamental normative principle for distinguishing between worthwhile development and maldevelopment. Further, the works of other development ethicists such as Denis Goulet (1995) also emphasize, like Ingram, the relevance of popular participation in the formulation of development policy. Yet Ingram's discussions of democratic agency and poverty research fail to engage with their work and thereby create the impression that development ethicists thus far had not considered the importance of democratic agency and bottom-up participation in development processes.

Finally, there are highly specialized normative discussions of migration (Chapter 3) and trade (Chapter 4) in contemporary political philosophy and normative political theory. Yet Ingram neither examines the central works on the ethics of migration by Joseph Carens (2013) and David Miller (2016), nor those on fair trade by Nicole Hassoun (2012) and Aaron James (2012). Instead, he situates his argumentations and policy proposals by using a very broad brush and differentiating them merely in quite generic ways from general normative approaches like utilitarianism and social contractarianism. Indeed, Ingram nevertheless manages to convey the discourse-ethical gist of his policy proposals in the areas of development, migration and trade. But any reader who is familiar with the specialized discussions would want to know how Ingram thinks that his proposals fare relative to those that have recently been put on the table for normative reflection.

On a methodological level, this observation suggests that the normative theorization of globalization has moved to a stage where all-encompassing analyses are prone to neglect the state of the art of the fine-grained academic accounts on the various areas of global governance. Of course, one would hope that all-encompassing analyses, in one way or another, would compensate for this neglect. That is, one would think that the treatment of a whole array of political issues related to globalization would bring out something that the disaggregated examinations of particular aspects of globalization miss. However, despite the considerable length of this book, the reader is left unclear which overarching or synthesizing insight, if any, is gained from the serial discussion of the various political issues of globalization. Rather, the impression that lasts is that of a rather fragmented assessment of seemingly separate political issues. Two reasons why the book has this effect on the reader are that Ingram provides neither a justification for his specific selection of the political issues nor a conclusion that would unite the conclusions that he reaches in the book's seven chapters.

In response to such a worry, Ingram might point out that the book's distinctive contribution consists of the application of a Habermas-cum-Honneth critical theory approach to various areas of global governance, rather than a unifying diagnosis of the contemporary pathologies of globalization. Ingram understands the critical theory approach as a form of immanent critique that employs principles which -- although they still await their full realization -- are already inherent within actual social practices, and which critical theorists can normatively reconstruct. The principles that Ingram thus reconstructs are -- following Habermas -- rational accountability and -- following Honneth -- mutual recognition (cf. 29-43). On Ingram's view, these principles are implied in the basic moral idea of "the equal dignity of the individual as a free agent" (p. 33). Ingram understands this idea as the fundamental normative characteristic of Western modernity, which represents, in his view, an irreversible "historical achievement" (p. 32). Preempting the critique that justifying a critical theory of globalization on such Western moral progress is parochial, Ingram argues that by now "'modern institutions' have long ceased to be a strictly Western phenomenon with the consequence that their corresponding rights and duties have become universally accepted" (p. 34).

However, Ingram does not provide any evidence showing that modern institutions actually are universally accepted. Nor does he attempt to clarify how the basic moral idea of "the equal dignity of the individual as a free agent" could be deemed consistent with the collectivist moralities of non-Western societies. For example, it is unclear how this basic moral idea could be rendered compatible with Confucian moralities that are still highly influential in contemporary China and which are premised on communal duties rather than individual rights. Nor does Ingram respond to the trenchant charge -- recently put forward by Amy Allen (2014) -- that such a strategy of normative grounding is implicated within (neo)colonial or (neo)imperial ways of thinking. After all, the claim that moral progress had occurred (exclusively) in the West constituted the core of the colonial and imperial powers' justificatory narrative of their civilizing missions.

Perhaps Ingram could have avoided the charge of (neo)colonial and (neo)imperial thinking if he had focused exclusively on a resolutely proceduralist theory that would allow for self-reflective challenges of its own universalist presuppositions. But Ingram differentiates himself from such a Habermasean type of proceduralist theory by moving beyond the principle of rational accountability and defending a substantive theory of justice that contains specific rights and duties. He grounds this substantive theory on Honneth's account of a "deep-seated need to be recognized as an integral personality aspiring to freely develop her agency" (p. 39). Thereby discursive justifications must center on proper interpretations and context-specific applications of that particular need for social recognition, but must not put into question that need's universal moral validity. This appears to be an appealing way of combining a deontological and a teleological approach, but it renders Ingram's approach once again subject to the charge of parochialism. For he would have to show that all individuals globally possess such a need. Ingram does try to do this by arguing that the "Western values of individual dignity, freedom, equality, and democracy emerged as responses to social changes that have now become global, so that this cultural legacy, too, has become global" (p. 42). This is indeed an intriguing thought, but in the absence of any evidence that showed that the underlying sociological claims hold true, Ingram's approach rests on somewhat speculative foundations. What is more, from a philosophical point of view, one would expect a conceptual exploration of how these Western values could be incorporated within or transform the dominant non-Western moral theories. For without such an exploration it remains unclear as to how the globalization of Western values could occur.

Despite these problems, Ingram's book represents a very remarkable scholarly achievement. It examines the political issues pertaining to globalization by relying on a practically oriented critical-theoretical approach that steers a path in between excessively positivist and excessively idealist approaches. Thereby this book is not simply an idle academic exercise, but offers the kind of "activist" or "engaged" normative theory that can be of real value for those who are struggling for emancipation.


Allen, Amy. 2015. The End of Progress. Columbia University Press.

Baran, Paul. 1957. The Political Economy of Growth. Monthly Review.

Carens, Joseph. 2013. The Ethics of Immigration. Oxford University Press.

Crocker, David. 2008. Ethics of Global Development. Cambridge University Press.

Frank, André. 1975. Capitalist Underdevelopment. Oxford University Press.

Goulet, Denis. 1995. Development Ethics. The Apex Press.

Hassoun, Nicole. 2012. Globalization and Global Justice. Cambridge University Press.

Honneth, Axel. 2014. Freedom's Right. Columbia University Press.

James, Aaron. 2012. Fairness in Practice. Oxford University Press.

Miller, David. 2016. Strangers in Our Midst. Harvard University Press.