World Without Design: The Ontological Consequences of Naturalism

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Rea, Michael, World Without Design: The Ontological Consequences of Naturalism, Oxford University Press, 2002, 245pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199247609.

Reviewed by Troy Cross , Yale University


In this provocative book, Michael Rea argues that naturalists are committed to substance dualism, antirealism about material objects, skepticism about other minds, and the suspension of judgment about idealism. His hope is that supernaturalism, which carries none of these unattractive commitments, will prove appealing by contrast.

What is naturalism? Despite a vast literature on the topic, no single, precise formulation has gained wide acceptance. Rea suggests this is for good reason, namely, that any substantive formulation, if it is to remain true to the spirit of naturalism, is doomed to incoherence. The naturalist tradition is staunchly committed to follow science wherever it leads, thus placing naturalism itself beyond the reach of scientific refutation. At the same time, the naturalist tradition is committed to the idea that all substantive philosophical doctrines – naturalism included – stand at the mercy of science.

This internal conflict reveals itself in both the metaphysical and epistemological varieties of naturalism. Metaphysical naturalism is supposedly the view that the sciences paint a complete and accurate ontological picture of the world; there are quarks, molecules and organisms, but not ghosts and gods. If naturalism is to follow science wherever it leads, however, it cannot rule out specific kinds of entities before science is complete. More generally, the problem is whether the science providing ontological guidance is current science or ideal science. If it is current science, then naturalism is probably false. If it is ideal science, then naturalism is metaphysically vacuous.1 Epistemological naturalism fares no better. If it is at the mercy of future developments in science, it cannot follow science wherever it leads. But if it is immune to empirical results, then it is self-refuting, because it is just the sort of hypothesis that epistemic naturalism insists must be grounded on scientific investigation rather than armchair theorizing.

According to Rea, charity suggests that we treat naturalism not as a doctrine to profess, but as a method to practice, a research program, i.e., a complete set of dispositions to treat certain types of sources as basic evidence. Because evidence is only recognized as such from within a research program, research programs themselves are “not adopted on the basis of evidence”, but are instead “…something we bring to the table of inquiry” (4-5). What naturalists bring to the table is the disposition to treat all and only the methods of science as evidentially basic. At present, these methods include perception, memory, testimony, standard criteria for theory choice, as well as the appearance of mathematical, logical, and conceptual necessity. Excluded are rational intuition and religious experience.

Naturalism thus construed is coherent, because one may be disposed to follow science wherever it leads and also hold that justified philosophical beliefs are at the mercy of science. But it is also defanged, because research programs cannot be argued for or adopted on the basis of evidence. They are rather the frameworks within which rational arguments take place, and within which it is decided what counts as evidence. Hence, the only way to urge the adoption of research program is to point out its pragmatic benefits. To urge against the adoption of a research program, one must either point out its pragmatic deficits or else show it to be self-refuting. Rea takes the former course with naturalism, arguing that among its dire consequences are the rejection of realism about material objects, the adoption of dualism, skepticism about other minds, and suspension of judgment about idealism.

Trouble begins with what Rea calls, the “discovery problem,” which “is just the fact that intrinsic modal properties seem to be undiscoverable by the methods of the natural sciences” (77). Our ordinary beliefs about material objects carry modal commitments. A statute, for instance, cannot survive smashing, but a lump of clay can. Such persistence conditions are integral to our very concepts of material objects. But how can a naturalist account for our knowledge of these modal properties? A naturalist observes a region of matter arranged statue-wise. Without appealing to a faculty of intuition, how can she justifiably infer that something in that region cannot survive smashing? There is only one way, according to Rea, and that is to adopt conventionalism: our conventions make it true that wherever there is some matter arranged statue-wise, there is something that cannot survive smashing. But conventionalism renders modal properties extrinsic, existing only in relation to us and to our mental activity. If minds like ours had not existed, then neither would these modal properties or, consequently, the objects that have them. That, says Rea, is just antirealism.

From antirealism follows a host of evils. First, substance dualism. If dualism were false, then minds could not exist unless material objects like brains existed. But by conventionalism, such material objects could not exist unless fairly advanced minds already did. Since at least one mind exists, dualism is true. Second, given that naturalists think non-physical minds play no role in the explanation of behavior, and given their newfound dualism, they must be skeptics about the existence of other minds. Third, without appeals to intuition, naturalists find themselves with no grounds for ruling out idealism. For, even if the hypothesis that there is a mind-independent external world is simpler than idealism, naturalism provides no reason to think that simpler hypotheses are more likely true.

If a naturalist has followed Rea to this point, she will no doubt be casting about for some weaker position that nevertheless stops short of Rea’s own supernaturalism, and a natural stopping point is intuitionism. If the naturalist adds rational intuition to the stock of basic evidential sources and says we rationally intuit intrinsic modal properties, she thereby protects the justificatory status of our beliefs about the instantiation of intrinsic modal properties and staves off conventionalism, dualism, and idealism.

But intuitionism is self-defeating. Adapting an argument from Plantinga, Rea makes the case that “… we have no reason to think that evolutionary processes could give rise to creatures that have reliable rational intuitions and, apparently, good reason to think that they could not” (194). For the purpose of survival, it seems not to matter whether we believe that S5 is the correct modal system or that material objects cannot be co-located. Furthermore, intuition, at least outside of logic, math, and conceptual truth, has an abysmal track record. Given the belief that our cognitive mechanisms are the products of evolution and given in addition the poor track record of intuition, one has a defeater for intuition-based beliefs; even if such beliefs are prima facie justified, their justification disappears upon reflection.

With the demise of naturalism and intuitionism, we are left with only supernaturalism, which grants religious experience basic evidential status. On the basis of religious experience, we may justifiably believe that the world is the creative work of a being “relevantly like the God of traditional theism,” and that this being has provided humans with a reliable means of detecting intrinsic modal properties (222-223). Such a supernaturalistic strategy offers the “only hope” for saving realism about material objects (225).

Many of the links in Rea’s chain of inference are objectionable, but I will note only a few. Most important is the characterization of naturalism. Obviously, a naturalist should not think that everything is at the mercy of science and also that naturalism itself is not. Rather than abandoning naturalism as a substantive thesis, however, she can weaken one of the conflicting theoretical commitments, holding for instance, that naturalism could be empirically refuted in some far-fetched scenario. This is certainly the right approach to metaphysical naturalism, where Rea’s forced choice between an inaccurate current science and a vacuous ideal science is overly simplistic. Here are three unoriginal suggestions that thread the horns of Rea’s dilemma: (1) the relevant science for naturalistic ontology could be “loosely tied” to current science, yielding a vague but still substantive position; (2) metaphysical naturalism could be opposed to metaphysical supernaturalism, where we have no tidy set of necessary and sufficient conditions to identify the supernatural, but we have paradigms – God, angels, fairies – and widespread, albeit imperfect, agreement on new cases; (3) following Jeffrey Poland’s work on physicalism, the relevant idealized sciences could be characterized by their specific questions and concerns.2

Epistemic naturalists, on the other hand, must make a choice if they wish to save naturalism as a substantive thesis. They must either constrain rationality to methods not radically different from those currently used in the sciences, or else say naturalism is knowable a priori and place naturalistic constraints on a priori knowledge. These suggestions may fall short of some purist vision, but they are substantive, coherent, and clearly, still forms of naturalism.

Rea’s “charitable” proposal on naturalism’s behalf, by contrast, is to be avoided at all costs. It is strange, first of all, that the naturalist is consigned to practice an epistemology she cannot rationally advocate or justifiably believe. But equally bizarre, none of the consequences of naturalism Rea reveals is supposed to carry any epistemic weight. Rea’s argument is not of the form: there are material objects, therefore, naturalism is false. That would be using the existence of material objects as evidence against naturalism. On Rea’s construal of naturalism, only a very restricted set of our beliefs can count as evidence, and the belief in the existence of material objects, like the belief in the existence of other minds, is not in the privileged set. But if it were stipulated that some view entailed that there are no material objects, that materialism is false, that we must be skeptics about other minds, and so on, naturalists would clearly consider these epistemic reasons against that view. Naturalists do not merely find these consequences unappealing from a pragmatic perspective. Rather, they think any view entailing such things is likely to be false, which is to say that if Rea is right about what naturalism is, virtually no one is a naturalist.

Moreover, the epistemological dispositions Rea foists upon the naturalist are foundationalist rather than coherentist and methodist rather than particularist. Neither of these strategies is compulsory for naturalists and both are required to generate Rea’s skeptical problems. A naturalist can be a coherentist, all of whose beliefs have prima facie justification, but who gives special weight to those beliefs that are highly confirmed by science, and a naturalist can be a Chisholmian particularist, testing proposed epistemic methods against paradigmatic cases of knowledge, with instances of scientific knowledge figuring centrally. A coherentist or particularist could ward off Rea’s skeptical attack by simply refusing the task of justifying our beliefs about the existence of material objects and other minds in terms of some sparse epistemic base.

But Rea accuses one such approach, that taken by Kai Nielsen, of “conflating the naturalist tradition with the tradition of materialism and atheism” (71) and dismisses another moderate view as half-hearted naturalism (49). Rea says he is interested in the consequences of “full-blown adherence to naturalism, not the consequences of partial or half-hearted adherence to naturalism” (49). We can all agree that whatever naturalism is, the interest lies in the commitments engendered by full-blown adherence to it. But the relevant question is what follows from a full-blown adherence to an epistemically sensible naturalism. After all, when Rea is offering supernaturalism and traditional theism as our “only hope” against radical skepticism, we cannot simply ignore more moderate naturalistic options (225).

Let us grant Rea’s characterization of naturalism for the moment and ask whether naturalists are then justified in believing in the reality of material objects. Perception is a science-approved basic source of justification, and on a suitably robust notion, perception delivers real material objects, not merely sense data or mind-dependent objects. If we accept Rea’s argument that our concepts of material objects contain persistence conditions, we can infer, by conceptual analysis, that anything satisfying those concepts has the persistence conditions in question. I see a statue, for instance. Then, by conceptual analysis (perhaps together with some straightforwardly empirical investigation) I infer the persistence conditions of statues. If by conceptual analysis it is also determined that a real statue must have its modal properties intrinsically, then since I have seen a real statue, I can infer that it has its modal properties intrinsically. So if we begin with a sufficiently robust notion of perception and appeal to Rea’s own promised conceptual connections, we have no “discovery problem”. We simply tollens the skeptical ponens.

Rea neglects this sort of reply because he assumes a highly impoverished notion of perception on which we do not see objects per se, but arrangements of matter, and then infer the existence of objects from general beliefs about the connections between arrangements of matter and the instantiation of modal properties (84, 105). Naturalists should simply reject Rea’s anemic, skeptic-friendly theory of perception and the artificial story about how we form material-object beliefs.

Coherentism, particularism, and a robust theory of perception thus each provide ample epistemic shelter from Rea’s skeptical attack. But there remains a problem. It is not a problem of justification, per se, but a problem of explanation. How do we account for the coincidence between some of the modal properties of objects (their persistence conditions) and our beliefs about them? Here, the hypothesis that the world is the product of a benevolent and intelligent designer provides a ready answer. Even if it is not strictly required to avoid skepticism, naturalists would do well to have an answer too. But Rea argues that no such answer is possible; the only naturalistically acceptable theories of the persistence conditions of objects are conventionalist, thus rendering extrinsic those properties and the ordinary objects that have them.

There is a familiar reply to this sort of anti-conventionalist charge: rigidification. Do not reduce the persistence conditions of objects at a world, w, to relations between the mind-independent ingredients of w and the mental activity at w. Instead, reduce persistence conditions to dispositions of the mind-independent world to cause a certain kind of response in minds like ours as they are in the actual world, in accordance with our actual conventions. Thus, just as the color that is actually my favorite would have existed even if I had not, so persistence conditions, as well as the ordinary objects having them, would have existed even if there were no minds. This is one overlooked strategy. Another is a reductive linguistic ersatzism paired with counterpart theory. Of course, naturalists owe a detailed account here, but the point is that there is no reason to think they face an explanatory problem they are in principle unable to solve.

Rea fails to make a convincing case against naturalism. Antirealism, dualism, skepticism about other minds, and the like do not clearly follow from epistemically sensible forms of naturalism. But he succeeds in aiding and motivating the construction of naturalistic theories. His dilemma forces naturalists to choose between two entrenched commitments. His skeptical argument warns against the dangers of a radically empiricist epistemology and highlights the urgent need for naturalistic theories of modality in general and of persistence conditions in particular. There is much more that is worthwhile besides – succinct and penetrating discussions of proper function, pragmatic rationality, Plantinga’s case against naturalism, and the “fine tuning” argument for God’s existence. Thoroughly researched and richly argued, World Without Design will prove valuable to anyone interested in the naturalistic tradition.


1. See Tim Crane and D. H. Mellor, “There Is No Question of Physicalism,” Mind 99 (1990).

2. Jeffrey Poland, Physicalism: The Philosophical Foundation (New York: Oxford University Press, 1994).