Worldly Virtue: Moral Ideals and Contemporary Life

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Judith Andre, Worldly Virtue: Moral Ideals and Contemporary Life, Lexington Books, 2015, 173pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739185827.

Reviewed by Brandon Warmke, Wake Forest University


"Virtues," Judith Andre tells us, "are acquired habits of understanding, perception, emotion, and behavior that promote the welfare of their possessor or of the community, and ideally of both" (p. 6). Though much has stayed the same, our world is very different from the one in which our grandparents received their moral educations, let alone the world inhabited by Aristotle. Modern technologies open up new ways to interact with the environment: it was once very difficult for humans to destroy the ecosystem -- not anymore. Dramatic cultural changes revise social roles and expectations. Demographic shifts enable interaction with larger and more diverse groups of people. Changing contexts create new obstacles and opportunities for human flourishing.

This simple insight serves as the basis for Andre's Worldly Virtue, a concise and accessible work of virtue ethics that aims to show how the realities of our contemporary world require us both to re-interpret traditional virtues and to recognize new ones altogether (p. 5). In addition to an introductory chapter setting out her notion of a worldly virtue, Andre devotes each of the next nine chapters to developing an account of a single worldly virtue. Some of these worldly virtues are revised versions of more traditional virtues; some are introduced as new virtues for the contemporary world.

In Chapter 1, "Framing Worldly Virtues," Andre argues that virtues are context-sensitive. When the world we inhabit undergoes drastic enough change, virtues change or even lose their meaning (p. 3). In a world of constant material abundance, for example, she suggests that the virtue of thrift "would have no meaning" (p. 3). (The same might be said of generosity.) Our understanding of the virtues, then, should be tethered to the realities of our world. Such "worldly virtues" are, for Andre, skills that enable us to navigate the world as we find it in morally ideal ways that promote our welfare (p. 7-8).

Though I will not pursue discussion of them here, I note three distinct features of Andre's approach to virtue ethics. First, Andre describes her work as having a generally Buddhist framework insofar as "the heart of many virtues is what might be called inner work -- noticing and gradually reshaping one's interpretation of what happens, and softening one's resistance to the truth" (p. 5). Worldly virtues, as Andre understands them, crucially involve coming to terms with the world as it is and one's place in it. Second, while Andre takes up a broadly neo-Aristotelian framework insofar as she thinks that the virtues promote the good life through the exercise of our rational capacities (p. 6), she rejects the Aristotelian doctrine of the mean for moral virtues (p. 8). Her primary rationale for this denial is the thought that lacking a virtue can be morally neutral: perhaps, she explains, there is no particular need for a virtue in one's society (e.g., physical courage in typical American lives), or perhaps there is no cultural space for it (e.g., humility in ancient Athens) (p. 8). In such cases, so the thought goes, lacking a virtue need not be thought to count against one's moral standing. And finally, regarding the meta-theoretical question as to whether virtue ethics can provide a theory of the moral rightness of actions, Andre takes a pragmatic approach (p. 9). While holding that virtue is action-guiding (i.e., the virtues indicate important moral considerations when deciding what to do), she is agnostic as to whether (or how) virtue is action-determinative (i.e., whether virtue tells us the right thing to do) (p. 9).

In Chapter 2, "Earthly Virtue," Andre articulates a non-traditional virtue, "virtuous materialism." While 'materialism' usually connotes something morally suspect, Andre seeks to carve out a morally admirable materialistic relation to the physical world. This virtue consists in paying attention to and properly valuing the material world around us, one that is infinitely complex, temporal, interconnected, mysterious, imperfect, and, in some instances, shaped by human agency (pp. 15, 17). How do we properly value the world around us? Most generally, we properly regard the world by not treating it "solely as a tool" (p. 18). Instead, virtuous treatment of the world involves regarding it as if it has intrinsic value (p. 18). Andre sidesteps the difficult axiological question as to whether the physical world has intrinsic value by claiming only that the virtue requires us to treat the world as if it has intrinsic value. But if worldly virtue requires us to have a clear eye about how the world actually is, then I cannot see why, without further argument, we are entitled to think that it is virtuous to act as if the world and its various configurations have intrinsic value, especially if this supposition is false. Setting that point aside, virtuous materialism more specifically requires us to first see the world as it is and not to destroy it without good reason (p. 18). However, we are not treated to an account of what can count as a good enough reason.

Why is this sort of materialism to be counted as a virtue? Andre suggests three reasons. First, virtuous materialism provides pleasure: much of the world is pleasant to see, touch, and hear, and to be virtuous is to take the time to appreciate the world and to learn about it (p. 21). Second, virtuous materialism allows us to act more rationally: by attending to a fuller understanding of the world, we come to look at things from diverse perspectives, and we blunt the attraction of acting in accordance with a simplistic individualism (p. 21). Third, and most substantially, Andre claims that virtuous materialism helps us to "accept fundamental but uncomfortable facts about our lives: they are transient, flawed, and contingent" (p. 21). Virtuous materialism therefore enables us to recognize these facts, accept our place in the world, and value these unavoidable features of our existence (p. 21).

Chapter 3 is devoted to developing Andre's account of the virtue she calls "open hope." As she understands it, open hope is a foundational habit that makes a virtuous life possible (p. 35, 40). Drawing from Lord Buddha and the twentieth-century German philosopher Ernst Bloch, Andre argues that open hope is an outlook that balances a patient, calm, and honest equanimity towards one's present situation (Buddha) with an open-handed and joyous receptivity to the unpredictability and complexity of what the future holds (Bloch). This Janus-faced disposition counts as a virtue in part because of the outlook it affords to us: one that promotes human flourishing insofar as it enables us to avoid both cycles of illusion (the Buddhist face) and despair (the Blochian face) (p. 42). I found this chapter to be the most difficult to work through. It is not always clear how Andre intends to use the notion of hope, how hope is to be "open," or how the Buddhist and Blochian faces are to be integrated.

In Chapter 4 Andre tackles the virtue of self-honor, a trait that properly balances self-sacrifice with self-value. Fundamentally, this virtue involves our "recognition, affective as well as rational, that we matter as much as anyone else does" (p. 46). To motivate her development of the virtue, Andre uses the case of modern motherhood. How might we understand virtuous self-honor when many mothers are drawn in opposing directions: self-sacrifice for their children and families on the one hand, and familial-sacrifice for their professional or personal plans and projects on the other? She concludes that in those cases in which helping "others adds to the moral value of what one does, and doing so at cost to oneself adds even more," virtuous self-honor requires us to ensure that three conditions are met: (1) that one maintains a "robust sense of one's own value"; (2) that one has undertaken a "serious search for alternative solutions to the problem" requiring self-sacrifice; and (3) that one attends to the "proportionality between what is saved and what is lost" (p. 56).

Andre turns to the virtue of compassion in Chapter 5. On her view, compassion is an empathic emotional response to the suffering of a particular sentient being together with a desire to help (p. 68). And as a virtue, compassion is the "disposition to experience the emotion appropriately, and a desire to help that is realistic" (p. 75). This seems on the right track so far as I can tell, though I wonder if it is possible to feel compassion for an environment, ecosystem, or nation-state, which, as such, are not sentient beings. Further, suppose that I have an empathic response to someone who is suffering, but my desire to help is extremely weak. Or suppose that I desire to help for purely selfish reasons (e.g., I want to get my name in the paper for helping save the cat in the tree, and so my desire to help is not properly connected to my empathy). Am I being compassionate here? In response to such cases, Andre might respond that she only intends to give an account of the paradigmatic or exemplar cases of compassion. Then she can accommodate these problematic cases by claiming that they are non-standard instances of compassion. At any rate, further development of these issues would be welcome.

In Chapter 6 Andre defends generosity's status as a virtue and provides an account of it. Some have claimed that, for various reasons, generosity should not be understood as a virtue. For example, it might be thought that true gifts (ones that are given with no hint of self-interest) are the only offerings that can count as acts of generosity, but that even so, such acts are impossible: all gifts are infected with at least a little bit of self-interest (such as the hope for reciprocity). But Andre argues (1) that it is not true that all acts of giving must be partly self-interested, and (2) that even if they are so motivated, this does not disqualify them from being acts of generosity, nor would it make such acts morally inferior (pp. 80-86). As to her positive account, Andre's working definition of generosity is that of a "disposition to give something with the intention of benefiting the receiver, and reliable success in doing so; the disposition to give easily, yet with an appreciation of what is surrendered; and to give beyond one's inner circle" (p. 86). There is much to like about this account. In particular it does not require that what is given is of significant value like some theories do; rather, the giver just must appreciate it. Further, it seems right to me only to require that one is reliable at benefitting the receiver instead of requiring that the receiver must be so benefitted.

In Chapter 7, "Facets of Honesty," Andre criticizes the extant literature on the topic (rightly, to my mind) for characterizing honesty as primarily the "avoidance of vice, and so as a form of strength: the strength to resist" (p. 97). On such views, honesty is the ability to avoid temptation to lie, cheat, or steal. But this is all quite negative. It is more illuminating, Andre argues, to "examine honesty in all its manifestations as a turning away from deception and toward open relationships, in which one is willing to know and be known, and seeks to be deserving of trust" (p. 107). This more positive take on the virtue of honesty allows us to unify the different kinds of behaviors that are typically taken to be trait-relevant. For example, Andre argues that "practice-honesty" is the trait that results in avoiding behaviors like lying, cheating, and stealing (p. 99), for it is a good that is committed to "cooperative, open, and trusting relationships" (p. 101). But there is also "noetic-honesty," the practice of seeking the truth, communicating the truth, and accepting the truth about ourselves and the world around us (p. 101). These practices too promote open and trusting relationships.

Chapter 8, "Humility Reconsidered," rejects common accounts of humility on the grounds that they tend to require over-intellectualization. For example, many popular accounts require that to be humble, one must have an accurate set of judgments about oneself and one's abilities. To overestimate either is to fail to be humble. On such views, Andre charges, humility turns out to be largely an intellectual accomplishment (p. 118). But humility is more than this. On her view, humility can be best thought of as the "ability to recognize and be at ease with one's flaws" (p. 117), which is a positive capacity to "accept in peace unflattering information about oneself" (p. 120). Such an account purports to explain why humility tends to bring about kindness towards others, inner peace, and compassion towards oneself, cognate phenomena that more standard, intellectualized accounts of humility have difficulty explaining (pp. 121-122).

In Chapter 9 Andre takes aim at traditional accounts of temperance that understand the virtue as primarily concerned with overcoming "bestial" temptations to pleasure: sex, food, drink, etc. But temperance requires more than a proper response to the possibilities of pleasure; it also requires an ability to cope with pain since, as she rightly points out, avoiding pain is often the root cause of addictive behavior (p. 134). On this more robust understanding of temperance, to be virtuous is to have a "complex ability to manage deeply human issues of desire and suffering" (p. 136). Such a person would be adept at handling one's desires to seek pleasure and to avoid suffering in ways that would promote one's flourishing.

In her final chapter, "Virtue and Age," Andre takes on the very interesting question of how, in a world of lengthening life spans, we can virtuously grow into old age. She argues for three primary traits. First, virtuous aging involves cherishing the present by learning to let go of certain possibilities (p. 144). As we age, our bodies give out, and we must give up on certain youthful hopes and dreams that have gone unfulfilled. Growing old virtuously means accepting these realities, which in turn fosters a greater appreciation for what one can accomplish in the present. Second, growing old virtuously requires accepting the past (p. 148). This involves recognizing and integrating one's past failures and successes into a fuller understanding of oneself, a task that forges a "resilient, honest, comfortable sense of self" (p. 151). And finally, in growing old, the virtuous will invest in the world, understanding that it will go on without them (p. 151). Devoting time to grandchildren, working for just social causes, and promoting the preservation of the environment are lasting ways to positively invest in the future. Virtuous aging requires additionally, however, that the rest of society support the elderly by properly respecting them and creating practical arrangements that ensure their safety and opportunities for fruitful social interaction (p. 154).

I may have given the impression that in this book, Andre is primarily concerned with theoretical accounts of these virtues and not concerned with their practical import or with appropriate methods for acquiring them. But that would be to give a misimpression. Andre is alive to these important issues, providing thoughtful examples in which these virtues promote flourishing (e.g., in health care settings) and suggesting a number of ways to foster these dispositions (e.g., through meditative practices). I point this out to make clear that while Andre has developed theoretical accounts of these virtues, she has not left us without suggestions for practical guidance. While, in my estimation, the book's arguments require further development at crucial junctures, Worldly Virtue contains some very interesting ideas.


Support for this work was funded in part by a grant from the Templeton World Charity Foundation. The opinions expressed in this paper are my own and do not necessarily reflect the views of the foundation.