Worth and Welfare in the Controversy over Abortion

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Christopher Miles Coope, Worth and Welfare in the Controversy over Abortion, Palgrave Macmillan, 2006, 350pp., $68.00 (hbk), ISBN 0333760182.

Reviewed by Gerald Lang, University of Leeds


Christopher Coope's book defends what he himself describes as a "somewhat naïve" account of the morality of abortion (p. viii), according to which abortion, at least in the vast majority of circumstances, turns out to be unambiguously homicidal. Stripped of its various twists and turns, the underlying argument is simple enough: foetuses are human organisms; human organisms, however young, possess interests, and can be harmed; and so the deliberate destruction of them is to be counted as murder, or as "something morally comparable … to the killing of a toddler" (p. 44). Though Coope's conclusions coincide with those of the natural law tradition -- a tradition presently upheld by John Finnis and David Oderberg, among others -- his route to those conclusions seems somewhat unaffiliated to any systematic body of ethical theory. Coope's central concern is to re-establish what he takes to be commonsensical truths, both moral and non-moral, the comfortable grasp of which has been calloused by the academic philosophical debate on the morality of abortion. It's a distinctive and unusual book, suavely written, prone to digression, and written in a highly distinctive voice, playful and querulous in turn.

The coverage of the book is less systematic than others -- he casts no more than a sideways glance at Judith Thomson's famous 'violinist' argument, for example. Coope is quite upfront about this selectivity of treatment, announcing: "Here, for once, is a book on this subject which does not pretend to answer all your questions" (p. 17). As might be expected, then, it covers less ground than David Boonin's recent A Defense of Abortion (CUP, 2003), or even the lengthy chapter on abortion in Jeff McMahan's The Ethics of Killing (OUP, 2002). Given his conservative convictions, Coope's central philosophical adversaries might have been expected to be writers such as Peter Singer and Michael Tooley. Instead, he spends much of the book engaged in an extensive and fairly hostile dialogue with a more ecumenical-seeming figure, Ronald Dworkin. (A long footnote, spread across pp. 29-31, is devoted to a round-up of the glowing reviews that greeted Dworkin's Life's Dominion when it was published in 1993. It is all too obvious what's coming up next.) Given the extensiveness of this engagement, it seems appropriate to begin by summarising Dworkin's views.

Dworkin provides a bifurcated account of the morality of killing. Prior to the formation of the central nervous system in the third trimester of pregnancy, foetal individuals have no mental life, and so no interests. This means, for Dworkin, that they do not enjoy the right to life; there is nothing, in effect, for that right to protect. After the development of the brain and the central nervous system, foetuses acquire interests, and therefore rights. That does not mean, however, that younger or less developed foetuses are morally negligible. Dworkin claims that they possess properties he variously describes as 'sacredness', or 'intrinsic value', or 'inviolability'. Dworkin's supposition is explained by certain patterns in our intuitive responses to abortion. Even confidently self-described liberals about abortion tend not to think that abortion is completely morally uninteresting. Decisions whether to abort remain grave or morally weighty. Similarly, confidently self-described conservatives about abortion are usually prepared to concede that there are circumstances in which abortion may be permissible: when the woman's life is in danger, for example, or when the pregnancy is a result of rape. These exemptions would be difficult to explain if it were really thought that abortion is straightforwardly murder. Dworkin surmises that both sides of the debate are actually united in the view that human life, merely as human life, enjoys a kind of sacredness, inviolability, or intrinsic value. But the sacredness of foetal life is only one of the dimensions of sacredness that can be expected to inform a woman's decision whether to abort. Whereas foetuses' sacredness is owed more to natural sources of investment, thus making abortion the cause of the frustration of those investments, the decision not to abort may frustrate specifically human sources of investment that have been poured into the pregnant woman's life and projects. The way in which this balancing act among the different dimensions of sacredness is played out in distinct individuals is, moreover, assimilated by Dworkin to manifestations of religious conviction, which ought to be beyond legal regulation.

Coope fails to report that Dworkin's appeal to foetal sacredness or inviolability is the outcome of the re-equilibriation exercise described above. He calls these arguments of Dworkin's "bad", but avers that "[i]t would be a distraction … to consider this matter here" (p. 44). Given the rather leisurely confrontations with Dworkin conducted elsewhere in this book, this reticence seems odd. The oddness ramifies further on. One possible weakness of Dworkin's argument is that it may have little to offer to die-hard conservatives who refuse to acknowledge any exemptions to the general prohibition on abortion. (A symmetrical worry arises, of course, with respect to die-hard liberals, who affirm that abortion is entirely morally inconsequential.) But Coope is not, in fact, a die-hard conservative in this sense: he concedes that abortion is permissible in circumstances where the woman's life is in danger, and tentatively speculates that the doctrine of double effect, or a tidied up version of it, may be able to accommodate the exemption without compromising the general force of the moral prohibition on abortion (pp. 11-12). (Frustratingly, he is silent on exemptions for rape or incest.) As far as Dworkin is concerned, then, we would expect Coope's commitments to be theoretically tractable. Dworkin's line on this matter is that a third party -- a physician, in this case -- cannot legitimately kill one innocent agent in order to save another innocent agent. This means, in turn, that a self-styled conservative about abortion who permits such an exemption isn't really of the opinion that foetuses have the right to life, whatever he might say; rather, he should accept that he is taking a particular view on the source of foetal sacredness, one which is heavily slanted towards natural investment, rather than human investment. But Coope doesn't take the bait. Except for that passing reference to the doctrine of double effect, Coope offers no sustained reply to this point, which obviously matters to Dworkin's argument, and which ought to have been crucial to their philosophical engagement.

In any case, Dworkin's account determines much of Coope's argumentative trajectory. In Part Two, he interrogates Dworkin's views on the 'value story', or on sacredness or intrinsic value. In Parts Three and Four, he contests the claim that foetal individuals lack rights by contesting the claim that they lack interests. I will consider these arguments in turn.

Coope is profoundly dissatisfied with Dworkin's treatment of sacredness or inviolability. Much of his dissatisfaction stems from the fact, as he puts it, that "inviolability in Life's Dominion tends … to be not-quite-inviolability" (p. 38): foetal not-quite-inviolability is manifest in the fact that Dworkin permits trade-offs between foetal inviolability and other, broadly ethical considerations. The charge, put summarily, is one of "semantic dilution" (p. 54). When all is said and done, though, the real charge here can only be one of semantic infelicity; perhaps Dworkin has chosen misleading terms to express his views. That does not exhaust Coope's concerns in this part of the book, which gradually yield a much more general attack on the very intelligibility of what he calls at one point "abstract, cosmic, Dworkinian, intrinsic value" (p. 76).

For Dworkin, as for Coope, the category of intrinsic value is evidently equivalent to final value, or value 'for its own sake'. (A standard example of an item that may have final value, but not intrinsic value, is a rare stamp: rareness is not an intrinsic property.) With this qualification in mind, I will continue to talk of intrinsic value, as do Dworkin and Coope. Why does Coope find the notion of intrinsic value unintelligible? The angle of attack varies. Sometimes 'queerness' worries appear paramount: such values are too metaphysically exotic to be tolerated as inhabitants in our ontology, and too elusive, given their metaphysical weirdness, to be detectable in any case. Yet Coope declares, at p. 93, that this is not his real worry. What emerges as Coope's chief complaint is that an appeal to intrinsic value degrades any intelligible justification we could have for caring about items of intrinsic value. More specifically: "it is not intelligible where a claim about this value is given as a reason why the valuable item should not be destroyed" (p. 91; original emphasis). Warming to his theme, Coope constructs ever more elaborate and sarcastic billboards describing intrinsic value: 'Importance In Itself' (p. 105), 'Notable Entities Abstractly Considered', and 'Impersonally Precious From the Point of View of Empty Space' (p. 153) all get a satirical airing. Coope's point is that, for believers in intrinsic value, these billboards must be somehow operative in justifications we give for protecting such valuable entities. And that is deeply implausible, as Coope points out: if we abhor the destruction of a Rembrandt painting, it is not because this would mean the disappearance of a Notable Entity Abstractly Considered.

What are we to make of this? It is easy, in truth, to make anything look silly if we use upper-case lettering in a certain way. Coope would have no hesitation in condemning murder. Murder is an injustice, and morality holds it to be seriously wrong. Do we refrain from murdering people, then, because Morality Strongly Condemns Murder? Why care about that? And what are the parameters on intelligible caring, anyway? Coope complains that an entity's possession of intrinsic value will have nothing to do with whether it is "useful, interesting, or attractive" (p. 132) to human beings. But the concern seems misplaced. Particularly when 'queerness' worries have been retired, defenders of intrinsic value need not suggest that the instantiation of intrinsic value is entirely unrelated to our ability to detect it, or to respond to it in appropriate ways. We award intrinsic value to something when we find that our evaluation of it cannot be captured within the categories of what Dworkin calls instrumental value, or subjective or personal value. Without intrinsic value, or something like it, our inventory of types of evaluation would be drastically incomplete.

Now Coope argues that what philosophers foolishly claim to be of intrinsic value is really accommodated by attitudes of love and respect. Coope defines love as "just that species of caring for which an inducement is not necessary" (p. 153). But this won't do. For it omits a crucial part of the phenomenology: in responding to a valuable entity with the kind of love or reverence that matters to moral valuation, we surely take ourselves to be responding to features that merit or call for that response, and which are such that the failure to experience love or respect would sustain a charge of moral insensitivity. We need to keep our eye on the properties of an entity, not just record the feelings or attitudes which that entity evokes in us. In doing so, we invite talk of value. In summary, Coope's arguments in Part Two failed to convince me on two counts: that the dismissal of intrinsic value would be uncostly, and that the retention of intrinsic value would be unreasonably expensive.

In Parts Three and Four, Coope is chiefly concerned to establish that foetuses have interests in continuing to survive, or that they have a good or welfare of their own. To do this, he casts a very wide net: all living entities, including non-sentient entities such as plants, can be said to have interests. Plants can flourish or wither, depending on the external conditions. And that, more or less, is enough to sustain the attribution of interests to them. For the purposes of argument, let us go along with Coope's broad view about the proper attribution of interests. The worry now is whether the demonstration that foetuses have interests is enough to show that their deliberate killing is morally condemnable. To put it another way, the question is whether the interests of foetuses are morally significant. Coope considers this question, but declares himself puzzled by it. He speculates that the denial that foetuses' interests are morally significant can only reflect an unprincipled prior determination to make abortion permissible at all costs, and claims moreover that "the notion of moral significance is extraordinarily indeterminate" (p. 271). But Coope's puzzlement is itself surely puzzling. The picture he has assembled yields the following observation: plants have interests which are thwarted by being uprooted, and adult human persons have interests which are thwarted by being killed. Now it is obvious that serious moral condemnation awaits only the latter, not the former. Leaving aside contingent extrinsic considerations (I may have no business in uprooting your lovingly tended geranium), it is morally innocuous to uproot a plant. So it can't be a living entity's mere possession of interests which explains why it would be seriously wrong to end its existence. How, then, can an engagement with the moral significance of an entity's interests be avoided?

Notwithstanding his declaration of puzzlement, Coope actually returns to this theme shortly afterwards, citing the valuable future that the foetus will miss out on if it is killed. (His account at this point appears similar to that proposed in Don Marquis's well-known article 'Why Abortion is Immoral', although Coope announces dissatisfaction with Marquis's efforts at p. 274, n. 88; it is something of a shame that he doesn't reveal the reasons for his disagreement.) Now Dworkin argues, correctly, that it cannot be the mere fact that a valuable life will be lived in the absence of abortion which explains why it is wrong to abort, for that consideration would lead to the condemnation of contraception, or abstinence. The difference between contraception and abortion, of course, is that, with abortion, we have an individual who will be killed -- the very same individual who will have prospects for a valuable life if it is not killed. Is that, then, all conservatives need to say? What further obstacles lie in wait for them?

One central consideration that preoccupies the abortion literature -- it is one about which Dworkin has rather little to say, but it is prominent in the work of Singer, Tooley, and McMahan, among others -- is that we had better avoid endowing the early foetus with a status that reflects nothing more than its membership of the species Homo sapiens. Yet that seems to be the only thing going for a foetus, morally speaking, given the absence in it of anything approaching occurrent mental capacity. Of course, an early foetus will become a human person if it is nurtured in the relevant ways: so might its potential be relevant? The foetus's possession of the potential to become a human person might secure for it a moral status which is not grounded purely in facts about species membership. But any appeal to potentiality is going to flood the moral constituency with risible candidates for moral status, as the academic literature's provision of 'magic wand' cases involving the transformation of non-persons (kittens, tables, plants) into persons is often taken to demonstrate.

Coope seems nonplussed about such matters. He is not concerned with the worries about speciesism, and he is also dismissive towards the topic of potentiality, declaring that it is "much used in superficial philosophising about abortion" (p. 260). And yet -- despite himself, perhaps -- he is, in the meantime, quietly assembling alternative structures for deployment against such worries. He embraces a quasi-Aristotelian account of 'natures', such that any intelligible verdicts on an individual's well-being and prospects can only proceed from a prior identification of that individual as a member of a certain type, rather than from the inspection of a momentary snapshot of the individual's mental profile. And he also has something potentially insightful to say about the literature's treatment of potentiality: "A pebble … would not be shown to have interests if it could be turned by a magic wand into a comfortable and pampered cat. This transformation would not do the pebble a kindness, or cure it of its defects. There is no such thing as a defective pebble" (p. 286). The suggestion is embryonic, and could have benefited from more sustained and less digressive discussion, as could his wider quasi-Aristotelian picture; but it is not without interest or promise.