Wounded Heroes: Vulnerability as a Virtue in Ancient Greek Literature and Philosophy

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Marina Berzins McCoy, Wounded Heroes: Vulnerability as a Virtue in Ancient Greek Literature and Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2013, 228pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199672783.

Reviewed by Håkan Tell, Dartmouth College


Marina Berzins McCoy sets out to explore philosophically the concept of human vulnerability in Greek thought. Vulnerability is defined not only as the ability to be subject to wounds, but also, and more importantly, as the "self-awareness and acceptance of being subject to harm" (205). The starting point of the argument is that human vulnerability in Greek culture should not be thought of as synonymous with weakness and lack of virtue -- a position that McCoy thinks has prevailed for too long in modern scholarship. Ancient Greek culture is less interested in valorizing self-sufficiency and strength (physical and moral) as qualities for emulation than has been hitherto recognized. When looking carefully at Greek culture, the argument goes, we detect a deeper sensibility for the centrality of vulnerability for the virtuous life -- both individually and socially. More specifically, vulnerability should be seen as potentially holding the key for a proper self-understanding of individuals and the broader social community.

It is thus not Greek culture that McCoy faults but modern scholars who have placed too much emphasis on self-sufficiency and strength (moral and otherwise) in Greek thought at the expense of a more nuanced consideration of vulnerability. Here she singles out Martha Nussbaum, in particular, as the culprit, especially in regard to her interpretation of Plato. In offering a counter-argument to what she sees as the communis opinio, McCoy pursues an exploration of how vulnerability is treated in Greek culture. What emerges is the thesis that vulnerability is a systematic tenet in Greek thought.  It is a tenet closely associated with virtue; a tenet that we can see developed and elaborated in the narrative medium of epic, tragedy, and philosophy.

In Chapter One McCoy makes two claims: 1) that in the Iliad vulnerability -- especially in the form of mortality -- is portrayed as central to establishing and maintaining interpersonal bonds, and 2) that vulnerability makes possible "a teleological narrative of human existence" (1). It is not entirely clear to me what these claims mean or what the precise relationship between them may be. The argument seems to be that only by accepting mortality, i.e., vulnerability, can the Homeric heroes embrace a view of human life that leads to activities that sustain intracommunal ties. McCoy explores this trajectory using three pairs: Agamemnon and Menelaos, Achilles and Patroklos, and Achilles and Priam. She concludes that the context of wounds and death offers Homeric individuals an opportunity for reflection on human existence and community-building practices.

McCoy then turns to Sophoclean tragedy to develop her analysis of vulnerability, treating the two different accounts of Oedipus in Oedipus the King and Oedipus at Colonus in Chapter Two. Theseus' acceptance of the marginal figure of Oedipus in Oedipus at Colonus is seen as the embrace of vulnerability by democratic Athens -- a compassionate act towards a stranger that will ultimately serve to protect the political community -- whereas Oedipus' ignorance in Oedipus the King leads to the dismantling of his own position and of the political stability of Thebes. Theseus' acceptance of Oedipus implies a more productive response to vulnerability than Oedipus' rejection of vulnerability in Oedipus the King. In Chapter Three, McCoy turns her attention to Philoctetes and the potentially beneficial qualities of the marginal and excluded figure to the community. Philoctetes' vulnerability -- both emotional and physical -- is seen as being accommodated as the action unfolds, first through the pity afforded Philoctetes by Neoptolemus, but also by Philoctetes' own acceptance of the unjust harm to which he has been exposed.

Beginning with Chapter Four McCoy moves away from epic and tragedy to philosophical texts. She turns first to an analysis of the mythical narrative towards the end of Plato's Gorgias about the judgement of naked souls. She acknowledges the challenge of finding an appreciation for the value of vulnerability in Plato, since his philosophy has often been interpreted as touting self-sufficiency and overcoming frailty. She detects parallels between Greek medicine and Socratic philosophic practices, and posits that Plato presents Socrates as providing a therapeutic treatment of his interlocutors' souls, a treatment that displays a deep appreciation for human vulnerability and weakness.

McCoy next considers the Symposium, where she discusses the relationship between vulnerability and eros. Eros, she maintains, is relational in Plato and implies a triadic structure involving "a lover, a beloved, and the creative acts that result from the encounter between lover and beloved" (116). This structure implies that human vulnerability and incompleteness -- far from being liabilities to be overcome -- are the cornerstone of eros and the root of human creativity (both in terms of procreation and intellectual production). The end goal of Platonic eros, according to this argument, is not the contemplation of the form of beauty itself, but the relational and dynamic lover-beloved relationship,.This relationship, at its core, is informed by vulnerability.

The last two chapters are devoted to Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics and the Poetics. McCoy first argues that the centrality that Aristotle gives to friendship in the Nicomachean Ethics is a testament to his appreciation for the importance of vulnerability to a virtuous life. This appreciation is particularly apparent in his discussion of the loss of a friendship when one friend has turned bad. Despite his frequent gestures at self-sufficiency, Aristotle validates the link between intimacy and happiness that friendship brings to the virtuous life. This intimacy, in turn, rests on vulnerability, something that Aristotle makes especially clear in his discussion of the loss involved when a friendship of virtue comes to an end.

In the last chapter McCoy considers the political function of tragedy and, by extension, performative art in general, by way of Aristotle's Poetics. She first takes issue with the traditional -- though highly disputed -- understanding of κάθαρσις (katharsis) as "purification," or "purgation," and instead promotes an interpretation of the term where it comes to mean "a kind of 'rebalancing' of the individual and also the community" (170). This rebalancing serves "as a mode of mediating social and political relationships and reorienting the community's epistemological and affective attitudes to the vulnerable" (209-10). In other words, one of the main functions of tragedy, attributed to Aristotle by McCoy, is to cause the audience to appreciate the sufferings of the city's marginalized populations -- and this it does to counteract the type of political swagger that can be seen, for example, in Pericles' funeral oration: "Tragedy provides a counterbalance to the community that praises itself too highly, or believes in the totality of its own virtue to the exclusion of suffering, conflicting obligations, marginalization, powerlessness, and like themes of tragedy" (202). On the last page of the book (210), McCoy leaves the readers with the admonition that we have much to learn from tragedy by emulating the Greeks in "recognizing a common bond between 'the vulnerable' and oneself."

There is much to like in this book. McCoy writes clearly and articulately about her subject matter, which makes it accessible to readers from a variety of disciplines. Incidentally, Oxford University Press has decided to offer a pdf version of it for free, so the price of the hard cover version -- a hefty $99.00 -- offers no obstacle to a wide circulation. Another strength is that McCoy resists the temptation of considering vulnerability only in philosophical texts. Instead she effortlessly moves among a range of different genres and authors. It is also refreshing that she pursues an interpretation of vulnerability that challenges what she sees as the traditional overemphasis on self-sufficiency. Even if I find it hard to accept some of the book's premises and conclusions -- more on that below -- I welcome the contention that Greek culture can contribute positively to our understanding of human vulnerability.

The main drawback of the book is how the term "vulnerability" is treated. It is not clear to me what McCoy understands by "vulnerability" and how it differs from suffering. Though she discusses Greek words and terms extensively throughout, there is a surprising lack of discussion of Greek terms that actually relate to vulnerability. Instead McCoy often seems content with an implied sense of what type of vulnerability is involved in any given context.  To cite a few examples, mortality is vulnerability in Homer's Iliad, or "wounds of rejection" (68) in the Philoctetes, or "nakedness" (93) in the Gorgias, or "epistemic vulnerability" (103) in the Apology, or the "political problem of woundedness" (105) in the Republic. By leaving the term "vulnerability" so open-ended and disconnected from the Greek, McCoy risks coming across as providing a set of essays loosely organized under the flexible rubrics of woundedness and vulnerability.

Did Greek authors explicitly address vulnerability? If so, what words did they use to express it? There seem to be missed opportunities to explore relevant Greek passages that address vulnerability, for example, in the Symposium where eros is explicitly discussed in terms of wounds and vulnerability. McCoy establishes a distinction between vulnerability and suffering (x), but it seems to be blurred in several places, especially in the discussion of tragedy.

Finally, a note on the editing. Most of the book is very well edited and almost entirely without typos and other errors. Quotations from the Greek, however, are a different matter. They contain a shocking number of typos and mistakes. Granted, many of the errors could be said to be minor (having to do with accents and diacritical marks). But there are so many of them -- and some are quite significant -- that they threaten to undermine the argument of the book, especially since McCoy is so careful to quote from and discuss the original Greek.[1] One should expect more from Oxford University Press. There is surely no shortage of people who can proofread the Greek to make sure that it is as accurate as the rest of the text.

[1] I did not do a complete count, but there are at least fifty mistakes in the Greek. Some are minor, for example, μύθος instead of μῦθος (viii, xi); but others are more serious, such as δαίμον for δαίμων (28), τύρρανος for τύραννος (41, 50) δέμος for δῆμος (60, 207); and some are just wrong, such as the assertion that the adjective ἐνδεής is a form of the verb ἐνδέω (133-34). One way to avoid these mistakes would be to use exclusively transcribed Greek, though, unfortunately, there are mistakes even when this is done, such as Chrystostom for Chrysostom (78), Pausanius for Pausanias (127-28), and Erixymachus for Eryximachus (138).