Writings from the Early Notebooks

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Friedrich Nietzsche, Writings from the Early Notebooks, Raymond Geuss and Alexander Nehamas (eds.), Ladislaus Löb (tr.), Cambridge UP, 2009, 274pp., $22.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521671804.

Reviewed by Rolf-Peter Horstmann, Humboldt Universität



This is the tenth volume by Nietzsche in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series, giving him the most books in the series (followed by Kant with seven volumes). Like all the other Nietzsche volumes, Writings from the Early Notebooks contains an Introduction followed by suggestions for further reading, together with bibliographical notes on the texts and notes on the translation. The texts are presented in a new translation. Added to them is an impressive number of very informative footnotes that provide the biographical, historical and intellectual background without which a lot of the material would be barely comprehensible. All these features make this volume, like many others in the series, very helpful for both students and researchers.

As the title of the volume suggests, the texts it contains are a selection. They come from the vast amount of notes — almost half of the historical critical edition of his works is filled with them — that Nietzsche wrote down throughout his life in many notebooks. Some of these notes are just a couple of words whereas others are of considerable length, sometimes filling several pages. They contain remarks and reflections on topics that aroused his intellectual curiosity, covering just about every conceivable field of human life ranging from contemporary politics and cultural history to art and aesthetic phenomena and above all to almost all domains of philosophy both theoretical and practical. The roughly 240 pages of notes in the volume are from the period between 1869 and 1879. That they represent a very exclusive selection is documented by the fact that the notes from this period in the historical critical edition cover around 1400 pages. This raises a question about the principles and the criteria of selection. Unfortunately, neither the editors nor the translator explicitly address this question. However, I have the impression that the guiding thread for the selection was the general relevance of the material selected for what Alexander Nehamas in his introduction tells us about Nietzsche’s preoccupations and main interests during that period. This impression is not just based on the notes chosen. It also suggests itself indirectly because of the inclusion of three texts discussed quite thoroughly in the introduction, two of which are normally not considered to be notes but fall under the rubric of unpublished writings (On the Pathos of Truth and On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense), while the third (On Schopenhauer) is from an earlier period. However that may be, the resulting collection is very convincing and informative.

In the introduction, Nehamas (who has done more than anyone else in the English-speaking world to secure Nietzsche his due place in the chain of serious philosophers) approaches the notes by identifying the overriding themes that occupied Nietzsche during the period. He then goes on “to discuss a few specific issues relevant both to Nietzsche’s notes and to his published works in order to indicate the various ways in which each kind of writing can cast light on the other” (XIX). This strategy brings some order into the material and is very convincing. Nehamas identifies Nietzsche’s dominant themes during the period as: “the philosophy of Schopenhauer, the music of Richard Wagner, and the importance of ancient Greek art and civilization for a renaissance of German culture” (XIV). There is no question that these three were indeed the dominant themes in the 70’s, and they keep resonating in one way or another, and with different intensity, in all his writings and notes. The value of Nehamas’ decision to focus on what is relevant to the published writings can also be seen from the fact that examining the notes with an eye merely towards what is mentioned in them most often would likely result in a list of disconnected subjects such as the philosophy of Kant, the Pre-Socratics (especially Heraclitus and Empedocles) and science and topics such as knowledge, truth and history. Such a list might be useful and even informative, but it cannot provide an introduction to the context in which the notes were written. It is such a context the reader of the notes needs; Nehamas is well aware of this.

However, a small question remains: even if we follows Nehamas’ hermeneutical maxim and uses Nietzsche’s published work from the 70’s as a measuring stick, we might be tempted to doubt the claim that Schopenhauer, Wagner and Greek art and civilization are the topics most pressing for Nietzsche during that period. It is hard to avoid feeling that there is a rupture both in style and thematic focus between Nietzsche’s published writings of the first half of the 70’s and those of the second half, i.e. between The Birth of Tragedy (1872) and the Untimely Meditations (1873-1876) on the one hand and Human, All Too Human (1878) on the other. Whereas The Birth of Tragedy and the Untimely Meditations are indeed outstanding witnesses of Nietzsche’s preoccupation with Schopenhauer, Wagner and Greek art, we might be less inclined to think of these topics as the organizing forces behind Human, All Too Human. These observations are not meant to be critical of Nehamas’ suggestions — on the contrary, I take them to be more plausible than any alternative could be. Rather they are intended to point to a more general question concerning Nietzsche-studies: does it really do justice to Nietzsche’s way of thinking to give his thematically scattered reflections some kind of unity by providing a topical framework for them? Maybe there is no unity and the notes reflect just this.

A similar question can be posed about how to approach an assessment of Nietzsche’s discussion of issues like truth or philosophy or art as well. In other words: what are the criteria of assessment? What is the equivalent to unity we are looking for when we are evaluating Nietzsche’s views? Much of the philosophical literature on Nietzsche pursues what I would call a ‘rational’ reconstruction which attempts to provide the most reasonable account of Nietzsche’s work. When evaluating, or even just describing, Nietzsche’s positions, what basis do we have for expecting him to have a high regard for, or at least to adhere to, the standard norms of rational discourse, i.e. to norms like consistency, definiteness or awareness of consequences? Many commentators do their best to convince us that there is a reasonable or rational story to be told about the issues Nietzsche deals with, thus in some way insinuating that Nietzsche can be subjected to the standard norms mentioned. In doing so we could even appeal to Nietzsche as a witness for this way of proceeding because when discussing the work of other people he himself treats them as at least implicitly committed to these norms. This is shown quite nicely in his treatment of Schopenhauer as documented in the small text On Schopenhauer contained in this volume. Here Nietzsche criticizes Schopenhauer in an almost ‘professional’ way by pointing out inconsistencies, conceptual ambiguities and fallacious inferences in his attempt to establish the will as a thing in itself and to defend the principle of individuation. This Nietzschean attitude to the texts of others can be seen as an invitation to or even as a demand for dealing with his texts in the same ‘rational’ manner.

But somehow this does not seem to be right because such an approach tends to make Nietzsche’s remarks and observations fairly tedious. Take, for example, two topics Nehamas discusses in his introduction: history and truth. Concerning history, we can find many illuminating outlines of the three ways Nietzsche says we can use to approach history and of his criticism of the ‘modern’ attempt to tackle history in a ‘scientific spirit’ because ‘scientific history’ has the tendency to wipe out human creativity. There is no doubt that this indeed is Nietzsche’s message. But this ‘discursive’ or ‘rational’ mode of presenting Nietzsche’s stance on history is in danger of giving his view a rather common-sensical, maybe even uninteresting, touch. Missing in this mode of presentation is the communication of that sense of urgency or of immediate uneasiness that seems to have been a driving force behind Nietzsche’s engagement with history as a major issue. I take it that it is this unsaid background that plays a decisive role in awarding Nietzsche’s material claims the status of important and interesting insights (if one is intrigued by Nietzsche’s texts at all). Nehamas addresses this background in his introduction, thus opening the way to a more complete understanding.

A structurally similar objection could be raised against a ‘rational’ reading of Nietzsche’s remarks on truth even if it is well informed. According to such a reading, we cannot avoid coming to the conclusion that Nietzsche’s view on truth is deeply flawed either because it denies truth altogether, which cannot be done without self-contradiction, or because it is based on, let us say, his bad arguments against correspondence. At the same time we have the feeling that such a criticism somehow misses the mark mainly because we are inclined to think that the mistakes attributed to Nietzsche in this context are so elementary and obvious that we would have to conjure up special reasons in order to ascribe them to him. After all, Nietzsche does not seem to have been an unqualified idiot. Thus there remains that sense of perplexity and confusion which refuses to acknowledge that the normal ‘rational’ reading accurately captures what Nietzsche was after in thinking about truth. Though Nehamas is well aware of the problems of Nietzsche’s remarks on truth, his introductory comments show that at the same time he is sensitive to, and insists on, the motivational and psychological environment in which Nietzsche’s statements are embedded, thus recognizing that the picture is much more complex.

If there really are these limitations to what I have called ‘rational’ readings of Nietzsche’s texts and if these limitations indeed encourage the suspicion that in the end Nietzsche’s claims are bound to be either trivial, common-sense, or rather silly errors, then one can recommend Nehamas’ approach to Nietzsche as a relieving antidote. Does this make him an ‘irrational’ commentator? If this term is understood to hint at the need for a richer reading, a reading that integrates more ‘perspectives’ than those available to rational reconstruction, then an ‘irrational’ interpretation might be promising. How such an interpretation might look one learns best from all of Nehamas’ work on Nietzsche (and on others as well).