Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, Volume 8: 1890-1892

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Charles Sanders Peirce, Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, Volume 8: 1890-1892, intro. by Nathan Houser, 2010, xcvii + 724pp, $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780253372086.

Reviewed by Christopher Hookway, University of Sheffield



This book is volume eight of a multi-volume edition of Peirce’s writings in logic and philosophy that was launched in the 1970s. The edition is important because, unlike most of its predecessors, it presents material chronologically, making it possible to study the development of Peirce’s thought. It is also invaluable because of the extensive study of manuscripts and texts which has been involved in its production. Many manuscripts have been re-dated, others have been reconstructed from fragments, and we are now provided with extremely reliable transcripts of their contents. And, as in previous volumes, the editors have included drafts of important published papers and a lot of unpublished material. The current volume contains fifty-six items, ranging from published papers on metaphysics to manuscripts on logic and mathematics and reviews, mostly from The Nation, on a wide variety of topics, including William James’s Psychology. Like earlier volumes, it contains a long introduction which gives us yet another chapter in a fascinating detailed and scholarly account of Peirce’s life and work as well as providing insights into American academic and philosophical life in the later nineteenth century.

The period covered by this volume is an important one in Peirce’s life. His teaching post at The Johns Hopkins University had lapsed in 1884, and he was struggling to earn enough to live on by working for the US Coast Survey and by writing definitions for the Century Dictionary. Around this time, Paul Carus launched a philosophical journal, The Monist. Peirce was in regular contact with Carus, and most of his writings between 1890 and his death in 1914, were either published in The Monist or intended for publication there, including five papers on metaphysics included in the present volume. Although not all are among the most accessible of his writings, these papers presented ideas that he had been working on for ten years or more and that continued to be important for his later work. Because these papers provide the intellectual core of the current volume, my comments will focus on them.

Since Peirce was best known in his lifetime as a logician and is probably familiar to contemporary philosophers mostly through his pragmatism and writings on the method of science, these papers may surprise some of Peirce’s readers. Pragmatism is usually understood as a tool for undermining the pretentions of ‘ontological metaphysics’. Peirce himself called it a form of ‘prope-positivism’, and, in many of his writings, it is associated with the rejection of the Kantian idea of a thing-in-itself. It is striking that the papers on metaphysics display some similarities to the German philosophical tradition of naturphilosophie, presenting a system of evolutionary cosmology and defending a form of objective idealism which shows the influence of Schelling and Schiller. There is no inconsistency here. Peirce’s project is one of ‘scientific metaphysics’ and his cosmological writings are informed by science and consistent with pragmatism.

The first of these papers, ‘The architecture of theories’, considers what sorts of concepts we should make use of when we construct a philosophical system. We should review the valuable ideas to be found in different sciences, observing the sources of their successes and failures. Most of the paper is dedicated to indicating how philosophy can benefit from this strategy, identifying ideas that can be drawn from dynamics, evolutionary theory, psychology, mathematics, and logic. Our intuitive reactions to hypotheses, the ideas that are backed by il lume naturale, can be trusted so long as we do not move far from the sorts of contexts in which we acquired them. But once we move beyond these familiar common-sense contexts, we need a different kind of guidance in evaluating the plausibility of hypotheses. Common sense is of no value when we try to understand atoms or molecules, for example. Instead, Peirce tells us, ‘we must search out a natural history of laws of nature, which may fulfil that function which the presumption in favour of simple laws fulfilled in the early days of dynamics, by showing what kind of laws we have to expect.’ When we find patterns in our laws, then we need explanations of those patterns. The only way in which we can explain the laws of nature is to attribute them to evolution, and his evolutionary story suggests that the world had become steadily more law governed through time. The successive papers develop the ideas that are sketched in the first, in most cases presenting a defence of Peirce’s distinctive theses by criticizing assumptions that are widely taken as obviously true.

‘The architecture of theories’ is followed by ‘The doctrine of necessity examined’, which provides a particularly clear account of the kinds of arguments that Peirce employs. The paper is an examination of ‘the common belief that every single fact in the universe is precisely determined by law’ (111). Why should we accept it? One answer to this question that he considers is that it is a ‘presupposition’ or ‘postulate of scientific reasoning.’ His response is to provide a clear account of his views about scientific reasoning, induction in particular. Since the results of induction are always provisional and its strength lies in it self-correcting character, Peirce is able to argue that scientific reasoning does not require the assumption of determinism at all. As well as responding to the charge that the idea of chance or spontaneity is incoherent, he argues that the rejection of determinism allows us to explain phenomena that cannot be explained on determinist principles. These phenomena arise in disciplines that deal with temporal processes. When we consider ‘the life of an individual animal or plant or mind’ or the ‘succession of forms shown by palaeontology’, we encounter what Peirce calls ‘growth’ which involves increase in ‘the complexity and diversity of things.’ Diversity and irregularity in the universe cannot be explained in deterministic terms. But, according to Peirce, diversity and processes that involve development through time can be explained only if we can tell an evolutionary story which allows for ‘infinitesimal departures from law’. The explanatory force of chance events and deviations from law persuades Peirce that the idea of chance is of fundamental philosophical importance. This is the doctrine that he calls ‘tychism’. This paper was very influential, prompting responses in The Monist from the determinist Paul Carus and also from John Dewey, in a paper called ‘The superstition of necessity’ which defended a sort of expressivist or epistemic account of modality.

Another concept which is fundamental to Peirce’s thought is discussed in ‘The law of mind.’ This is synechism. Synechism is ‘the tendency to regard continuity … as an idea of prime importance in philosophy.’ Although this topic had been part of Peirce’s philosophical armoury since the 1860s, he became increasingly concerned with the logic and mathematics of continuity, contributing to debates with Cantor and others. The paper contains a discussion of Peirce’s views of the logic of continuity, and distinguishes some of the fundamental concepts from which an understanding of continuity can be constructed. The assumption that is attacked here is an atomistic conception of thoughts and mental action, the idea that thoughts are discrete individuals, thought consisting in one thought following another. If we adopt this picture, he asks, how can ideas wholly in the past be thought at all any longer? (136). He concludes that knowledge of past ideas is possible only through ‘direct perception’. We can be conscious through a period of time, even through an infinitesimal period of time; the past event can be present in our experience. The present is connected to the past ‘by a series of real infinitesimal steps’ (137). If we add to this Peirce’s ‘law of mind’ which holds that ‘ideas tend to spread continuously and to affect … others’, Peirce claims that he can account for the flow of time and its direction. Andrew Reynolds, in his excellent Peirce’s Scientific Metaphysics (Nashville, Vanderbilt University, 2002), shows how Peirce’s metaphysical preconceptions are shaped by the need to understand processes that are not reversible, that have a direction, and the direction taken by his thinking reflects current work in physics and psychology. Both tychism and synechism — the recognition of the importance of chance and continuity — are of value because of their relevance to these issues.

’Man’s glassy essence’ promises ‘to elucidate the relation between the physical aspect of a substance and its psychical aspect’. This account of the mind body problem begins with an exploration of a ‘molecular theory of protoplasm’, discussing the relations between solid and liquid states of protoplasm, before offering speculations about how protoplasm can acquire the capacity to take habits and suggestions about how protoplasm can feel. Peirce continues to show how we can make sense of living creatures and the mental as no different from protoplasm in general in making the sort of case for the idealism which forms part of his cosmology. Matter is described as mind made hidebound by habits: matter is a particularly simple form of mind rather than a complex kind of material object. This is one important root of Peirce’s commitment to a distinctive kind of idealism.

The target of the fifth paper in the series, ‘Evolutionary love’, is the conception of practical rationality derived from economics: ‘intelligence in the service of greed ensures the justest prices, the fairest contracts, the most enlightened conduct of all the dealings between men, and leads to the summum bonum.’ (186). The public-spirited love of mankind may be admirable, but it cannot be put into practice effectively, and Darwin’s Origin of Species ‘merely extends politico-economical views of progress to the entire realm of animal and vegetable life’ (189). The later sections of the paper compare some different models of evolution, criticizing Darwin’s conception of ‘evolution by sporting’ and Spencer’s ‘evolution by mechanical necessity’. Peirce’s own view of evolution, not worked out in detail, breaks with the economist’s model of rationality and has a Lamarckian character.

Peirce’s review of William James’s Psychology (231-239) reflects some of the philosophical attitudes that are found in these papers. His ‘tribute of respect’ for James’s book consists in a set of objections to his methods and views. His reactions offer an interesting light on just what Peirce found irritating in James’s writings on pragmatism, and in doing so it emphasises the ‘German’ side of Peirce’s philosophy. The first part of the review shows how James ‘is constantly wresting words and phrases of exact import to unauthorized and unsuitable uses.’ He also criticizes James’s descriptions of how science works, particularly objecting to his claim that ‘every natural science assumes certain data uncritically’ and to James’s reliance upon a strict distinction between science and metaphysics to dismiss without much argument any form of idealism. As we have seen, Peirce himself would offer a scientific defence of his objective idealism. In general he objects to James’s methods as involving a ‘destructive’ kind of originality, his views all being based on ‘negative or sceptical considerations’ (232).

The remainder of the review uses James’s discussion of whether perception is ‘unconscious inference’ in order to point out his poor grasp of the value of formal logic in philosophy. According to Peirce, most psychologists hold the ‘monist view’ that ‘the intellectual process of inference and the process of mechanical causation’ are ‘the inside and outside views of the same process.’ He himself would prefer the ‘idealist’ view that the ‘logical explanation is the more perfect’, while James ‘is naturally averse to the logical explanation.’ This fits Peirce’s frequent complaint that James had little interest in, or capacity for, logic.

Overall, Peirce sketches some metaphysical and cosmological ideas which reject a body of determinist, individualist and egoist ideas that had formed one important theme in nineteenth-century thought. Although there are similarities with approaches found in the German philosophical tradition, there is a major difference. Peirce’s metaphysical inquiries are informed by extensive knowledge of the sciences, logic and mathematics, the fundamental ideas he employs being taken from concepts that have contributed to the success of the sciences. In cosmology, psychology, and the progress of scientific and philosophical ideas, he is aware of the challenges raised by irreversible processes, by processes that involve what he calls ‘growth’. The ideas that are sketched with varying degrees of detail in these papers, he thought, would set an agenda for his work for decades to come.