Writings on Common Law and Hereditary Right, consisting of A Dialogue between a Philosopher and a Student, of the Common Laws of England

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Thomas Hobbes, Writings on Common Law and Hereditary Right, consisting of A Dialogue between a Philosopher and a Student, of the Common Laws of England, edited by Alan Cromartie, and "Questions Relative to Hereditary Right," edited by Quentin Skinner, Oxford University Press, 2005, 264 pp, $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198237022

Reviewed by Mark Murphy, Georgetown University


Oxford University Press has undertaken an ambitious project, the Clarendon Edition of the Works of Thomas Hobbes, which is scheduled to run to twenty-six volumes and is to include not only Hobbes's great works in metaphysics, ethics, and politics, but also his mathematical and scientific works, his writings on rhetoric, his translations of Homer and Thucydides, and his correspondence. We are very early in this project's unfolding. The Clarendon project absorbed Howard Warrender's 1983 editions of the English and Latin versions of De Cive, which set a high standard: these volumes include a number of excellent plates, a full scholarly apparatus, and Warrender's lucid historical and textual introductions. Next to appear, in 1994, were two volumes of Hobbes's correspondence, edited by Noel Malcolm, which are not only a remarkable achievement but also delightful reading. Now we have Writings on Common Law and Hereditary Right, which includes scholarly editions of Hobbes's A Dialogue between a Philosopher and a Student, of the Common Laws of England, edited and introduced by Alan Cromartie, and the (extremely brief) manuscript labeled "Questions Relative to Hereditary Right," edited and introduced by Quentin Skinner. I will consider each of these texts separately, as the only reason for including them together (apart from the facts that both were composed late in Hobbes's career, and concern questions of law) in a single volume is publishing convenience (the "Questions" manuscript is about 600 words, and even with the editor's substantial introduction goes to only 25 pages or so).

The composition of Hobbes's Dialogue cannot be precisely dated, but we do know that it could not have been completed earlier than 1661 and by Cromartie's account was likely not finished until around 1670 (Writings, p. xiv). Its nominal topic is the English common law system, and indeed the first question considered in detail is whether there is, in addition to the written statutory law and the unwritten natural law, a common law whose authority derives from its being enunciated by those who have developed facility in a certain artificial reason, that of the common law. But the discussion extends beyond this particular question: the Dialogue contains discussions of natural law, sovereignty, the English system of courts, and a variety of criminal offenses, with the result that much of the political and legal doctrine developed by Hobbes in The Elements of Law, De Cive, and Leviathan reappears here. The characters of the Dialogue, Lawyer and Philosopher, have unsurprising roles: the Lawyer (for the most part) docilely trots out an eminent line on questions of law, often reporting the opinions of Sir Edward Coke (who is Hobbes's main target in the Dialogue); the Philosopher then sets matters straight by relentlessly advocating a Hobbesian line on these matters.

Hobbes is not a master of the dialogue form. (His artlessness led one of his critics to say of another dialogue Hobbes wrote -- an appendix to the Latin Leviathan -- that Hobbes's characters 'A' and 'B' should have been named 'Thomas' and 'Hobbes'; see John Wallis, Hobbius Heauton-timorumenos (Oxford, 1662), p. 15, cited in A. P. Martinich, Hobbes: A Biography (Cambridge, 1999), p. 320). So the reasons to go to Hobbes's Dialogue are not to be found in an appreciation of its literary merits, though Hobbes's wit cannot help but shine through at points. Nor should readers go to the Dialogue to see arguments for theses defended in Leviathan developed at greater length, or in a novel way; on the contrary, these theses are presented in an entirely familiar but compressed way, less precisely and with less argument. Nor should readers go to the Dialogue to find points on which the Hobbes of Leviathan altered his positions. Joseph Cropsey, whose useful edition of the Dialogue was until the publication of this Clarendon volume the only easily available version, suggested that there were significant changes, noting that evidence for there being at least "a difference in emphasis between the teaching of Leviathan and the teaching of the Dialogue [is] indicated by the fact … that Hobbes never once refers by name to the state of nature in the Dialogue" (University of Chicago Press, 1971, p. 13); this would perhaps be a significant point if it weren't that Hobbes nowhere uses the expression "state of nature" in Leviathan, either.

Indeed, what is most noteworthy is not only the consistency between the theses of Leviathan and the theses of the Dialogue but the extent to which the theses of Leviathan manage to get mentioned in this fairly short work. In the Dialogue Hobbes recapitulates his accounts of the relationship between reason and appetite (Dialogue, p. 12; Leviathan, viii, para.16, p. 41 of the Edwin Curley edition, Hackett, 1994); of the centrality of death-aversion (Dialogue, p. 85; Leviathan, xiii, para.14, p. 78); of the sources of discord outside a condition of sovereignty (Dialogue, p. 12; Leviathan, xiii, pp. 74-78); of the distinction between "law" and "right" (Dialogue, p. 35; Leviathan, xiv, para.3, pp. 79-80); of the definition of justice (Dialogue, p. 13; Leviathan, xv, para.3, p. 89); of the definition of "just man" and "just action" (Dialogue, p. 34; Leviathan, xv, para.10, p. 93); of the limits on the binding power of the law of nature (Dialogue, p. 32; Leviathan, xv, para.36, p. 99); of the character of the laws of nature as immutable and eternal (Dialogue, p. 114; Leviathan, xv, para.38, pp. 99-100); of the need for sanctions to back up authoritative law (Dialogue, p. 14; Leviathan, xvii, para.2, p. 106); of sovereignty as the final judge of what is good for the commonwealth (Dialogue, p. 129; Leviathan, xviii, para.8, p. 113); of the burdens that effective sovereignty can impose, and the unworkability of all alternatives (Dialogue, p. 23; Leviathan, xviii, para.20, pp. 117-118); of the definition of civil law (Dialogue, pp. 29, 31; Leviathan, xxvi, para.3-4, p. 173); of the ways in which custom can become law (Dialogue, p. 63; Leviathan, xxvi, para.7, p. 174); of the impossibility of law's being against reason (Dialogue, p. 64; Leviathan, xxvi, para.11, pp. 176-177); of the essential character of promulgation in law (Dialogue, p. 32; Leviathan, xxvi, para.12, p. 177); of the subordination of the judiciary to the legislator (Dialogue, pp. 27, 54-5; Leviathan, xxvi, para.20, 22, pp. 180, 180-181); of the role of judges in interpreting law (Dialogue, p. 11; Leviathan, xxvi, para.23-28, pp. 181-184); of presumption in law (Dialogue, pp. 126-127; Leviathan, xxvi, para.24, pp. 181-182); of the justification of punishing crimes against the law of nature (Dialogue, p. 114; Leviathan, xxvii, para.4, pp. 191-192); of the distinction between crime and sin (Dialogue, pp. 41-42; Leviathan, xxvii, para.1-2, pp. 190-191); of the disastrous character of attempts to limit sovereignty (Dialogue, pp. 16-17; Leviathan, xxix, para.3, p. 211); of the rejection and renunciation of private judgment (Dialogue, p. 26; Leviathan, xxix, para.6, p. 212); of the rejection of the ultimate coherence of legal limitation on sovereignty (Dialogue, p. 36; Leviathan, xxix, para.9, p. 213); of the limitation on property rights through sovereign's discretion (Dialogue, p. 141; Leviathan, xxix, para.10-11, p. 213); and of the importance of good counsel to effective sovereignty (Dialogue, pp. 20-21; Leviathan, xxx, para.25-27, pp. 231-232). There is no need to multiply examples.

Why, then, should anyone interested in Hobbes's views turn to the Dialogue? One reason is to see Hobbes putting his legal and political theory to the test. Hobbes was not easy with law -- as Cromartie argues, he was neither a complete novice nor an expert lawyer, a condition familiar to most philosophers of law who never trained as practitioners -- but he is clearly straining in the Dialogue to show how his legal theory can illuminate the goings-on in English law and legal history. An example: Hobbes carries out an extended discussion about the relevance of various statutes to the relative jurisdictions of various courts (Dialogue, pp. 51-53). The upshot of the maddening tracing of this tangle, though, is the edifying Hobbesian point that "You see by this, that the Jurisdiction of the Courts cannot easily be distinguished, but by the King himself in his Parliament" (Dialogue, p. 53), that there must always be a final decider who has the authority to stipulate an end to such problems (see, for example, Leviathan, xxvi, para.21, p. 180). Of course, much of this sort of application will be unintelligible to those readers who are not seventeenth-century English lawyers, but this difficulty is attenuated by Cromartie's extraordinarily helpful introduction and notes, which lay out when necessary the structure of the English system of courts that Hobbes is dealing with and cite and often quote the statutes that he is commenting upon. Cropsey's edition is fairly good on this, but Cromartie's is undoubtedly much the superior.

Another reason to turn to the Dialogue is historical / biographical -- to read it not in light of what we can learn about Hobbes's theories but rather in light of what we can learn about Hobbes. Cromartie's substantial introduction to the text is organized around the aim of showing that Hobbes wrote the Dialogue in order to defend himself against the charge of heresy. (That it is organized around this theme is not to say that its contribution to this argument is its only merit -- Cromartie's introduction is quite good in historical scene setting and in mapping the prevailing intellectual currents on common law.) I am not fully persuaded by Cromartie's case, though it impressively documents through comparison of texts the expansion of Hobbes's awareness of the relevant law on heresy, and connects this expanding awareness with Hobbes's growing fear of facing legal proceedings for heresy. While we might very well agree with him that Hobbes's discussions of heresy are central to the text, and that the text shows signs of the heresy material's being well-integrated with the design of the dialogue, frankly I am unsure how to assess the view that this is its overall argumentative point. Hobbes was surely concerned about heresy, and he was doing a lot of writing about heresy as a result, but it is not clear to me why we should think that this is the impetus toward this particular composition.

The Dialogue was unpublished in Hobbes's lifetime (though it enjoyed some unofficial circulation while Hobbes was alive); it was printed by Hobbes's publisher, William Crooke, in 1681. The second part of this new Clarendon volume consists of a manuscript -- or, more precisely, a portion of a manuscript -- left at Chatsworth when Hobbes died; it was discovered by Quentin Skinner and first published in his "Hobbes on Sovereignty: An Unknown Discussion" (Political Studies 13 (1965), pp. 213-218). Skinner offers the manuscript with a minimum of editing; it includes both a question posed to Hobbes -- "If a Successour to a Crown, be for Some reason or other which is notorious, incapable to protect the people, if the Government should devolve upon him, is not the Prince in possession oblig'd to putt him by, upon the request of his subiects?" -- and Hobbes's reply. Skinner argues that the handwriting of the question is that of the fourth earl of Cavendish, and argues on the basis of the history of the Exclusion controversy and Cavendish's role in it that Cavendish likely posted the question to Hobbes from Parliament in early summer 1679. The answer is in the handwriting of Hobbes's friend James Wheldon, who served as Hobbes's amanuensis when Parkinson's, or some similar infirmity, left Hobbes unable to do substantial writing; the interlineal corrections seem, though, to be Hobbes's own. Skinner's textual and historical introductions are, characteristically, first-rate, providing not only a clear account of the character of the Exclusion crisis but also Cavendish's own role in it.

What do we learn from examining these few lines from Hobbes? As Skinner notes, these are the last lines on political matters that we have from Hobbes; he died from a stroke but a few months after its composition. It would be wonderful if we were able to find evidence of a new development in Hobbes's late thought, or to see a surprising or at least nontrivial application of Hobbesian premises to a new problem. But our hopes are dashed here, it seems to me. Skinner's introduction nicely draws out possible meanings from Hobbes's highly elliptical and at points simply unintelligible manuscript. His main technique of doing so, though, is to read the manuscript in light of the theses of Leviathan, which pretty much ensures that we will not find anything surprising in it. Skinner does suggest that we may have intimations of development of Hobbes's theory of rights, and of his views on how, concretely, sovereigns are instituted (Writings, pp. 168-169, 166), but Hobbes's words on these points are of course so brief and ambiguous as to ensure that Skinner's speculations are very thinly supported. While we may have difficulty making sense of Hobbes's arguments here, we can take some comfort in the fact that apparently Cavendish, Hobbes's correspondent, had worse troubles understanding Hobbes than we do: apart from evidence in the manuscript that Hobbes was a bit irritated at Cavendish's lack of familiarity with Hobbes's work, Skinner reports that after Hobbes's death Cavendish publicly argued, relying on Hobbes's premises and Hobbes's authority, for the view that subjects may judge their sovereigns to have violated the limitations on the covenant that gives those sovereigns legitimacy, and on that basis subjects may justifiably rebel (Writings, p. 175). As Skinner notes, "If Hobbes had not died a year earlier, this would surely have been enough to kill him off" (Writings, p. 176).

We are greatly in Cromartie's and Skinner's debts for the quality of their editing work on these texts and their historically rich introductions that supply the intellectual, political, and personal context for their composition. Having received the benefit of the application of their tremendous learning, we can say with confidence that what we can learn about the development of Hobbes's legal and political philosophy from the Dialogue and the "Questions" is: Not much.