Wrong-Doing, Truth-Telling: The Function of Avowal in Justice

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Michel Foucault, Wrong-Doing, Truth-Telling: The Function of Avowal in Justice, Fabienne Brion and Bernard E. Harcourt (eds.), Stephen W. Sawyer (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2014, 344pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226257709.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


This volume consists of six lectures, preceded by an inaugural lecture and followed by three interviews, that Michel Foucault delivered in 1981 at the Catholic University of Louvain in Belgium at the request of its School of Criminology. That fact has bearing on the lectures themselves. In these lectures (six of which were transcribed from videotapes, and the inaugural lecture from the manuscript), Foucault offers a rough genealogy of practices of what in French is called aveu, and is translated here as avowal.[1] Near the end of the final lecture, Foucault considers the role of avowal in recent penal practices, and it is clear that his interest is in good part giving an account of how avowal came to have the place it does in those practices.

For those who have read the recently released Collège de France lectures On the Government of the Living, some of the material will be familiar. Other parts harken back to Foucault's first Collège de France presentations, Lectures on the Will to Know. However, the structure of these lectures is, to my mind, unique in Foucault's corpus. Rather than focusing on a period of several hundred years, as was his normal practice, he covers a broad sweep from Homeric Greece to the present. In that sense, the Louvain lectures are not a genealogy in the sense many of us have come to identify in Foucault's work. Rather than showing how the intersection of particular practices give rise to something that had not previously existed (madness, sexuality, the normal, etc.), the lectures trace changes over nearly three millenia in the way subjectivity was constituted in particular practices through the changing nature of avowal. As with his standard genealogies, Foucault is interested here in the relation of subjectivity and truth. Moreover, that interest is focused on the way certain forms of subjectivity are constituted by certain practices of truth. However, whereas in other works the focus is on the emergence of those forms of subjectivity as historical novelties, here the focus is on the changing nature of a particular type of practice: that of avowing. To put the point another way, whereas in the genealogies the focus is on new emergences, in the Louvain lectures it is on the evolving character of a particular practice.

Foucault defines avowal at the outset as "a verbal act through which the subject affirms who he is, binds himself to this truth, places himself in a relationship of dependence with regard to another, and modifies at the same time his relationship to himself." (p. 17) This is, one might say, the "historical constant" through which he follows the changing nature of subjectivity in its relationship to certain practices of truth-telling. In general, these practices will have to do with what might, a bit anachronistically, be called guilt or, as the English title has it, wrong-doing (mal faire in French). Foucault claims that there has been not only a change in the character of avowal, but a growth of it within and across different institutions over the course of Western history since ancient Greece. His particular interest in avowal, in keeping with his concerns in this phase of his thought, is the relation of avowal and governmentality, or, as he puts it, "governing through truth." (p. 24) Thus there is here a historical intertwining of types of subjectivity, practices of avowal, and governance.

Foucault announces at the outset that the six lectures will be divided into three periods: ancient Greece, the early and medieval Christian period, and modernity. (As it turns out, the fifth lecture is mostly concerned with Christian developments.) The first two lectures focus on particular texts, the Iliad in the first case and Sophocles' Oedipus Rex in the second. In particular, the first lecture discusses the chariot race organized by Achilles to honor the memory of Patroclus. The race has five contestants, of whom two, Antilochus and Menelaus, are of the greatest interest. Menelaus is senior hero Antilochus. However, when they arrive at a narrow part of the track, Antilochus refuses to give way to Menelaus, and as a result bests him in the race, coming in second behind the demi-god, Diomedes. At this point, there is a problem. To be sure, Antilochus crossed the finish line before Menelaus, and to be just as sure, did so without cheating. However, as Menelaus is the senior hero the finishing places do not reflect the skills of the drivers, that is, the truth of their standing in relation to their skills. So Menelaus challenges Antilochus to take a traditional oath that he did not use trickery. Antilochus doesn't take the oath, and thus cedes second place to Menelaus. Here, Foucault argues, the avowal is not to someone else and not about who one is. Rather, it arises in the context of a challenge, an agon. Antilochus is required to answer, not to Menelaus, but to the gods, for his behavior. The scene offers what Foucault calls an alethurgy, a staging of the truth. As it turns out, the history of avowals in Foucault's eyes is a history of alethurgies.

The second lecture turns to a reading of Oedipus, a much discussed play to which Foucault himself often returns. In fact, at the outset he apologizes "that today I am going to offer what may be the millionth reflection on Sophocles' Oedipus Rex." (pp. 57-58) In this particular reading, Foucault focuses on three alethurgies in the play: that of the gods, that of kings, and that of the servants. The gods, for their part, speak when and how they please, and offer truth at their pleasure. This is instantiated not only in the original prophecy that Oedipus will kill his father and marry his mother, but also in the contestations that occur between Oedipus and Tiresias. Oedipus, for his part, can read signs and discover truth in them -- think here, for instance, of his solution to the riddle of the Sphinx. However, the servants, through whom Oedipus finally discovers the truth of himself, display truth through avowal. They are forced to speak, and forced to speak the truth of what they have seen. Their avowal is neither one of who they are nor of what they have done, but rather of what they have witnessed. As Foucault points out, the play is characterized, particularly in Oedipus' speech, by the use of legal terms. Thus, as with the Homeric scene, there is a judicial aspect to the alethurgies staged in the play.

The third and fourth lectures are concerned with early Christianity, penance in the third lecture and self-examination in the fourth. Foucault contrasts the Christian practices of penance and self-examination with pre-Christian practices, noting that in the latter case, for example in Seneca's De Ira, there is no search for the truth of oneself but instead an examination of conscience that is supposed to lead toward wisdom and right action. In Christian penance, however, one must first assume the status of a penitent, a status that can only be granted by the institution of the Church. Once this status is assumed, the penitent must undergo something that is less like a judicial procedure and more like martyrdom, a self-mortification. This self-mortification, Foucault argues, does not involve avowal -- nothing needs to be spoken -- but does stage a truth, i.e., become an alethurgy, through one's sacrifice of oneself in the name of one's sin.

If the ancient practice of self-examination is in any way continuous with Christian practice, it appears not in penance but in the monastery. However, the structure of monastic self-examination has four significant differences from its ancient counterpart. The pre-Christian art of examining oneself has a goal (that of wisdom), utilized a spiritual guide who possessed wisdom, followed a particular code, and allowed that one can go beyond the need for a guide when one has attained wisdom oneself. Monastic self-examination contrasts with this art in all four ways. Because it is tied so closely to obedience, there is no end point and no attaining of final wisdom. There wasn't a particular code to follow, and the person to whom one avowed did not need to be a master. It was the act of avowal itself that constituted the proper form of obedience. Moreover, as monastic practice develops, the focus of avowal changes from acts to thoughts. As Cassian argued, the mind is often agitated and so incapable of proper contemplation of God. This agitation allows diabolical thoughts to enter. Avowing one's thoughts allows one to discriminate between what is proper contemplation and what is self-delusion, because only thoughts that are pure can be spoken and thus revealed to the light.

The fifth lecture brings together elements from penance and monastic practice in the development of early medieval Christianity. Here is where avowal becomes central in Christian practice, a movement that, Foucault notes, has influence in the philosophical tradition through a hermeneutics of the self whose elements can be found in Descartes, Locke, Schopenhauer, and Freud. In the seventh century, there is a development of a fixed penance with stable structures as monasteries and convents become economically integrated into everyday life and as Germanic law is introduced into Christian practice. This involves an importation of a juridical orientation into Christianity, especially with regard to penance. The juridical orientation is furthered in the eleventh to thirteenth centuries through sacramentalization, where confession becomes annual, priests decide the penalties for sin and then "absolve" the sinner, and the general relation to God becomes a legal one. All of this ties avowal in the form of confession to a juridical structure. As a side note, Foucault says that one of the most important aspects of the Reformation was its attempt to de-juridify Christianity.

The final lecture addresses the increasing institutionalization of avowal and its role in disordering penal practice. Through the medieval period avowal remains central to penality as is testified to by torture -- the attempt to extract an avowal that becomes a test of the tortured. With the rise of modern states and the evolution of penality, avowal changes its role but does not decline as it becomes a first step in reintegrating wrong-doers into the social order. Throughout this history, avowal is alethurgical rather than symbolic or performative. It is a staging of the truth, not simply a representation or re-enactment of it. However, in penal practice the role of avowal becomes more vexed, particularly in the nineteenth century. Avowal becomes tied to understanding, to explaining as well as imputing an action. A series of spectacular crimes, though, that seem to have no motive and therefore cannot be explained, pose challenges to the role of avowal. This raises the demand for explanation that is not primarily personal, and thus one sees the increasing role of psychiatry in penal practice.

However, psychiatry is not simply involved in explanation. It is also implicated in the emerging general regime of public hygiene. This complex of psychiatry, penality, and public hygiene leads to three displacements. First, there is a displacement of focus from the crime to the criminal (a displacement that will be immediately familiar to readers of Discipline and Punish). Second, there is a displacement from a concern with the act to that of general dangerousness. Finally, instead of concerning itself primarily with the modulation of the penalty, the juridical system becomes more concerned with the protection of the general public. Foucault claims that, "We entered at this precise moment, I believe, an entirely different regime: that of security." (p. 223) Those familiar with Foucault's work will recognize this term from his two lecture series on governmentality, Security, Territory, Population and The Birth of Biopolitics, where the emergence of the concept of the population and of probability statistics contribute to a shift from individual responsibility to general social protection and coordination.

The three interviews that follow the lectures allow Foucault to place his thinking about penality in a wider context. These interviews are complemented with an excellent essay by the editors Fabienne Brion and Bernard Harcourt that traces the development of Foucault's thought about the role of avowal.

One puzzle that follows the reading of these lectures comes from their long historical sweep. With the radical differences between, say, Antilochus avowing that he did not use trickery and a modern defendant avowing the motives that led to a certain crime, it can be wondered whether there is really enough of the same thing going on to warrant placing them under a common term or ascribing them to a single practice. Here, I think, the continuity Foucault would cite would be that avowal concerns the changing relationships between subjectivity, truth, and first personal speech. In both cases, and indeed in all the cases described by the lectures (with the possible exception of penance, which, after the initial avowal of the need for penance, is not primarily linguistic), there is a formation of subjectivity that occurs through a speaking of truth. And, as Foucault would no doubt insist, by tracing the different ways in which this speaking occurs, we can see different forms of subjectivity in play.

If this is right, then these lectures highlight an issue that I mentioned briefly at the outset. In contrast to how Foucault's thought is often conceived, they are as much about continuity as they are about discontinuity, or better, they are about how discontinuity appears within continuity. That is, they are about how a single type of performance or practice -- avowal -- changes its character, and thereby the character of subjectivity, over the course of slightly under three thousand years. However, if we look at Foucault's other works, we might see the same dynamic in play within shorter time frames. Discipline and Punish, for instance, ties the changes in the relation of subjectivity and truth to a continuity of penal practice and of the body as its object. The first volume of History of Sexuality traces changes of subjectivity and truth in relation to erotic practices. Perhaps, then, one of the things the Louvain lectures shows us, writ large, is an aspect of Foucault's work that is often neglected in the attempt to focus on his commitment to historicizing: that for histories, even genealogical histories, to be constructed, one must not only trace the changes themselves but also that which is changed and therefore remains, in its changes, continuous.

[1] The editors note that they prefer the term avowal to the more commonly used confession, since the former has a wider use, which better reflects the variety of uses in the lectures.