Wrongdoing and the Moral Emotions

Wrongdoing And The Moral Emotions

Derk Pereboom, Wrongdoing and the Moral Emotions, Oxford University Press, 2021, 204pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192846006.

Reviewed by Pamela Hieronymi, University of California, Los Angeles


In this book, Derk Pereboom provides further elaboration and defense of his long-standing vision of a world without retributivism. This volume builds on his earlier work, of which he provides useful summaries. The result is exactly what we have come to expect from Pereboom: a dialectically engaged, avowedly revisionist, humanely pursued vision of life after “basic desert.” In presenting his vision, Pereboom draws both on the Stoics and on the Buddhist tradition.

The book is thick with references to those in Pereboom’s immediate contemporary subfield, and the unfolding of Pereboom’s own ideas typically proceeds by way of engagement with these interlocutors. In providing my overview, I will identify some thinkers from further afield who might also fruitfully be brought into conversation (with an eye to possible pairings in syllabi).

First, the starting point: The foundation of Pereboom’s work is skepticism about the possibility of the sort of “free will” required for what he calls “basic desert.” He introduces the reader to “basic desert” in the book’s first chapter. According to Pereboom, a person deserves harm or treatment experienced as painful in a “basic” way if the justification for imposing that harm or pain relies on nothing beyond the fact that the person did something morally wrong while being “sensitive to its being morally wrong” (11). In particular, if the justification goes by way of consequentialist or contractualist considerations (as it arguably would in, say, the justification of penalties imposed in a game or late penalties for homework assignments) then the claim that a person deserves the burden is not “basic” (12).

What Pereboom calls “moral responsibility in the basic desert sense” is moral responsibility that allows the possibility of deserving harm or pain in this basic way. He focuses on responsibility of this sort because, he explains, this is the sort that separates the members of the debate in which he is engaged. (This first chapter lays out the dialectic of that debate, guiding the reader through what can be a terminological minefield.) Pereboom uses “free will” to pick out “an agent’s ability to exercise the control in acting required for her to be morally responsible [in the basic desert sense]” (9).[1] He rehearses his previous arguments against free will of this sort. The result is what he calls “free will skepticism.”

In opposing “basic desert,” Pereboom has long advocated that we substantially revise our reactions, relationships, culture, and society to take its absence into account.[2] In this most recent book, he addresses a number of pressing questions about his proposal, focusing on those concerning the moral emotions.

The first three chapters consider anger. Pereboom believes that moral anger typically presupposes basic desert (2). Although he officially allows for non-retributivist forms of moral anger, they are largely set to the side. Because moral anger typically presupposes basic desert, skepticism about basic desert “would destabilize [moral anger and] tend to result in its fading away” (35). Thus, in advocating that we give up our belief in basic desert, Pereboom must consider how and whether human social life could survive without moral anger. In Chapter Two, he suggests that moral anger can and should be replaced by what he calls a “stance of moral protest.”

Pereboom’s examples of people who adopt a stance of moral protest (without anger) are Mahatma Gandhi and Dr. Martin Luther King Jr. (7). In addition to pointing to these exemplars, Pereboom provides some elaboration of his idea. He says that this “stance” is “a posture of mind that has certain functions, which are manifest as dispositions to act. . . . It is a stance of opposition to an agent for having performed . . . immoral action . . . or having . . . a disposition to act immorally” (39–40). He distinguishes his “stance of moral protest” from the reactive attitudes (such as resentment and indignation) by appeal to the fact that moral protest has “forward-looking objectives”:

the stance of moral protest motivates engagement with the wrongdoer, which may be confrontational. But, unlike the reactive attitudes, it is distinguished by its forward-looking objectives, typically aiming to change . . . the agent’s dispositions to act. The ultimate goal of many instances of moral protest is to transform states of affairs beyond an agent’s dispositions, for example . . . the life of a family, or . . . social justice. (40)

I will critically consider Pereboom’s proposal to replace anger with a stance of protest after providing an overview of the rest of this volume.

The third chapter makes a rather intricate point. Pereboom believes “it is possible for an agent to wrongly pose a threat without being morally responsible for doing so,” and, further that, in such cases, we often have a right to self-defense. These facts, he thinks, pragmatically justify certain emotions, because “defensive action against wrongdoing is justified and involves risk [and] an appropriate emotional attitude is arguably required for it to succeed” (54). However, he notes, the required emotion need not presume basic desert. Thus, he thinks, we are justified in adopting what he calls a “measured aggressive stance.” This stance provides the required emotional backing, so to speak, for risky self-defensive actions, but falls short of moral anger. It “presupposes that its target wrongly poses a threat [without] the assumption that its target deserves the infliction of pain or harm” (54).

Pereboom is explicit that it is this measured aggressive stance, rather than moral anger, that should be in play in contexts of oppression. He notes,

One aspect of the immorality of selecting classes of people for subjugation is that the measured aggressive stance is standardly forcibly barred by the subjugating group, and often, as in the case of American slavery, with the use of violence. This in turn instills a standing resentment among the abused, and instilling resentment is itself an insidious form of abuse. (75)

Chapters Two and Three would serve as an interesting foil to some of the recent work on anger in the context of oppression. Pereboom engages with Macalester Bell and, through her, Frederick Douglass. To this could be added recent work by Myisha Cherry, Amia Srinivasan, and Sukaina Hirji, as well as the earlier figures they draw upon, such as James Baldwin, Audre Lorde, and Marilyn Frye.

The fourth chapter provides a surprisingly detailed account of the justification of a non-retributivist criminal justice system. The justification depends in large part on empirical claims, as Pereboom acknowledges. Though Pereboom cites some studies in support, the chapter is not an exercise in political science. Rather, its main contribution is the particular justificational structure Pereboom advances: he starts with the special deterrence view proposed by Daniel Farrell, which relies on the idea that the state inherits, as a kind of proxy, the victim’s right to self-defense. Pereboom adds two pieces: a justification of confinement as a kind of quarantine and the possibility, in certain restricted cases, of imposing more severe penalties justified by the value of general deterrence. Pereboom also here confronts the challenge of ruling out preemptive action against those we can predict will cause harm. The resulting vision is what he calls, following Gregg Caruso, a “public health model” of criminal justice. This chapter would serve as a sometimes-foil, sometimes-companion to Erin Kelly’s The Limits of Blame.

The remaining chapters take up forgiveness (Chapter Five), love (Chapter Six), and hope (Chapter Seven). The challenge is to explain how each is possible in a world without free will, in which a stance of moral protest replaces moral anger.

Many philosophical accounts of forgiveness assume that forgiveness is the overcoming of resentment or some other hard feelings. However, if these emotions are manifestations of moral anger, then, given that there will be no moral anger in Pereboom’s imagined world, there will also be no forgiveness. Pereboom replies with the suggestion that we understand forgiveness, not as the overcoming of resentment, but instead as the renunciation of the stance of moral protest.[3]

Pereboom opens his chapter on love with John Milton’s account of Satan’s fall. Milton suggests that God granted his creatures the power of free choice, despite its foreseeably dire consequences, because without freedom love would be impossible. Pereboom disagrees: love does not require free will. To make the case, he surveys contemporary philosophical accounts and, in doing so, pieces together his own compatibilist view of love. An interesting companion to this chapter would be Sartre’s view of love as both requiring and hoping to transcend freedom.

The final chapter, on hope, takes up the theological problem of evil, arguing that although “Responses to the problem of evil are far from decisive . . . they nevertheless allow for rational hope that a providential God exists” (149). In fact, the chapter seems to me to do two things: first, argue for this rational hope and second, advocate for a kind of Buddhist or Stoic acceptance of whatever happens.

In this final chapter Pereboom briefly argues against Richard Swinburne’s freedom-based justification of God’s allowance of eighteenth-century slavery. However, Pereboom does not address what is, in my mind, most offensive about the passage he cites: It mentions only the possible free choices of the various white enslavers, as though they were the only agents on the scene and as though the troubling thing was that they were allowed to misbehave. It completely overlooks the freedom of the enslaved children of God themselves.

I suspect the task of theodicy is misguided; evil seems best met, by theists, with neither justification nor acceptance, but rather with silence, suffering, humility, and courage—with an affirmation of faith and an appeal to mystery. Job was not given a justification.[4] An interesting companion to this chapter would be Howard Wettstein's reflections on Job in “Illuminated by Meaning.”

I return, now, to Pereboom’s treatment of moral anger. He claims that “When we are angry with wrongdoers for their immoral actions, we assume they could have avoided acting as they did” (9).

I do not.[5] To illustrate, consider an entrenched chauvinist, someone who’s self-esteem would not survive the shift to seeing himself competing with women on an equal playing field. When this person bemoans having to “lower our standards” in order to promote women at the same rate as men, without recognizing that what feels to him like “lowering” is in fact returning the standards to where he keeps them for men, he does something infuriating. His way of thinking and acting are disrespectful and damaging to careers and lives. I resent them and I am indignant about them. But I do not, for a moment, think this person could avoid thinking and acting as he does. Revising his way of seeing the world would require a psychological overhaul that he could neither envision nor engineer. He is caught in a kind of blind alley; he likely entered it before he could avoid it and he lacks the wherewithal to escape it. But the fact that he cannot avoid his disrespect does not render it any less disrespectful. The standards of respectful interaction with others, like the standards of parenting or policing, are held in place by the needs and interests of those they protect. They do not shrink to fit the tragic inabilities we often enough encounter. And my resentment registers his disrespect: the fact that he could not avoid the disrespect no more undermines my resentment than the fact that someone could not make themselves more reliable would undermine my distrust. Whether he could have done otherwise is quite beside the point.

Pereboom may hope to identify my anger as his “stance of moral protest.” But that stance is forward-looking, with aims and objectives. My anger is not. It is, as Peter Strawson noted, reactive— it is my reaction to my perception of the quality of the chauvinist’s will, of his practical outlook and my place within it. It is, I believe, my recognition of the threat his thought and action pose to myself and other women. Whether my resentment will accomplish anything is, again, for better or worse, beside the point.

Importantly, what we might call the “social function” of an attitude can part ways with the subject’s own reasons for it.[6] Taking pride in my teenagers’ accomplishments serves the function of building their self-esteem. But I do not, and cannot, take pride in their accomplishments in order to build their self-esteem (though I might express my pride for that reason). Likewise, negative reactive attitudes may serve the function of providing a disincentive and marking a wrong as unacceptable. But I do not resent in order to sanction, punish, or protest.[7] After all, if I were to judge that, given the negative consequences, I ought not to punish or protest, I will not, thereby, revise my resentment.[8]

The fact that these attitudes are not forward-looking has the salutary consequence that, in reacting to the quality of others’ wills, we need not be in the business of punishing them, training them, issuing demands to them, launching a protest against them, or otherwise engaging with them in anything that could be understood as a kind of voluntary treatment. Our engagement is simpler and less invasive.[9]  

Though Pereboom officially allows for non-retributive anger, it seems to me that he does not keep fully in view the possibility of an angry reaction that is neither retributive nor forward-looking. His argument against non-retributive moral anger seems to occur in the first chapter, and it is wholly pragmatic: He claims, first, that angry responses, even non-retributivist ones, tend to make things worse (a claim supported with citations to numerous studies). Second, he claims that we can and often do change our emotional tendencies, both individually and culturally. And therefore, Pereboom concludes, we should train ourselves to avoid even non-retributive moral anger.

In drawing this conclusion, Pereboom overlooks an alternative vision of a world without retributivism, one that comes into view once we remember that it takes two to tango: If angry reactions make things worse by eliciting undesirable responses, we should consider whether it is the one responding to the anger, rather than the one who is angry, who should be remade. Pereboom’s observation that our responses are open to cultural shifts cuts in both directions. Perhaps, rather than being less angry, we should be less defensive or fragile in the face of anger.[10]

Pereboom has written another engaged and engaging account of his vision of life after free will. He provides a helpful roadmap of the literature in which his work sits. His claims and ideas will resonate further, interacting with a variety of thinkers from a broader swath of philosophy. I recommend it for those near and far.


Bell, Macalester. “Anger, Virtue, and Oppression.” Feminist Ethics and Social and Political Philosophy. Ed. Tessman, Lisa. Dordrecht: Springer (2009). 165–83. Print.

Caruso, Gregg D. “Free Will Skepticism and Criminal Behavior: A Public Health Quarantine Model.” Southwest Philosophy Review 32.1 (2016): 25–48. Print.

Cherry, Myisha. “Love, Anger, and Racial Injustice.” The Routledge Handbook of Love in Philosophy. Ed. Martin, Adrienne. New York: Routledge (2019). 157–68. Print.

Farrell, Daniel M. “The Justification of General Deterrence.” The Philosophical Review 104 (1985): 367–94. Print.

Hieronymi, Pamela. “Articulating an Uncompromising Forgiveness.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62.3 (2001): 529–55. Print.

---. “Fairness, Sanction, and Condemnation.” Ed. Shoemaker, David. Oxford Studies in Agency and Responsibility (2020). Print.

---. “The Force and Fairness of Blame.” Philosophical Perspectives 18.1 (2004): 115–48. Print.

---. “I'll Bet You Think This Blame Is About You.” Oxford Studies in Agency and Responsibility: Essays on Themes from the Work of Gary Watson. Eds. Coates, Justin and Neal Tognazzini. Vol. 5. Oxford: Oxford University Press (2019). 60–87. Print.

---. Minds That Matter. in progress. Print.

---. “The Wrong Kind of Reason.” The Journal of Philosophy 102.9 (2005): 1–21. Print.

Hirji, Sukaina. “Oppressive Double Binds.” Ethics 131 (2021): 643–69. Print.

Kelly, Erin. The Limits of Blame: Rethinking Punishment and Responsibility. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (2018). Print.

Pereboom, Derk. Free Will, Agency, and Meaning in Life. Oxford U.P. (2014). Print.

---. Living without Free Will. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2001). Print.

Sartre, Jean-Paul. Being and Nothingness. New York: Washington Square Press (1956). Print.

Srinivasan, Amia. “The Aptness of Anger.” The Journal of Political Philosophy 26.2 (2018): 123–44. Print.

Wettstein, Howard. “Illuminated by Meaning.” The Cambridge Companion to Religious Experience. Eds. Moser, Paul and C. Meister. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press (2020). 99–115. Print.


[1] I have always found the connection between “basic desert and freedom” in need of explanation: Why should freedom render one basically deserving of pain or harm? Of course, any proposed explanation runs the risk of being a justification that would render the desert non-basic. I provide an explanation of why something like “basic desert” should follow from a(n implausibly) strong form of freedom in Hieronymi (2020). However, since that explanation goes by way of a broadly contractualist justification of fairly imposed sanctions, it would not count as “basic desert” as Pereboom here defines it.

[2] See Pereboom (2001, 2014).

[3] Understanding forgiveness as a renunciation allows forgiveness to be voluntary, and so to part ways with the (perhaps non-voluntary) stance or attitudes that one has renounced. Yet, if what is renounced is non-voluntary, we still need to unearth the right kind of reasons for it. I attempt this for resentment in Hieronymi (2001).

[4] He was given a rebuke—the same rebuke St. Paul gives to those Roman readers who would question God’s justice.

[5] The ideas in the next few paragraphs can be found in Hieronymi (2004, 2019) and her Minds That Matter (in progress).

[6] What we might call “the right kind of reason.” See Hieronymi (2005).

[7] I once characterized resentment as a kind of protest (Hieronymi 2001). I now believe the point should be refined: resentment functions as a protest in our social life. Perhaps, in resenting, I am in some way taken up into that protest (as I might be taken up into building my child’s self-esteem), but I do not resent in order to protest. See Hieronymi (2019).

[8] (Though my anger may suffer a fate analogous to wishful thinking.) Similarly, my anger may have the social function of Pereboom’s “measured aggressive stance”: it may support risky, self-defensive action. But, again, that function is the wrong kind of reason for being angry, and thus whether I am justified in my anger does not depend on it serving this role.

[9] The chauvinist, of course, is likely to feel otherwise—he may feel I am punishing him unfairly. He is wrong; I am not punishing him at all. I am not his mother and I am not sending him to his room. Nor am I his teacher; I am not aiming to improve him. Nor am I the state or some other institution, distributing burdens in a way that must take into account the interests of each. I am simply another adult, and I am simply registering, in my own emotions, the threat that his way of seeing the world poses to myself and those like me. See, again, Hieronymi (2019).

[10] In fact, I wonder whether the counter-productive responses Pereboom cites are triggered by anger or instead by graceless accusation. If the latter, then simply shifting away from anger to, say, non-aggressive but nonetheless condescending criticism may not avoid the problems.