You Must Change Your Life: Poetry, Philosophy, and the Birth of Sense

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Lysaker, John T., You Must Change Your Life: Poetry, Philosophy, and the Birth of Sense, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2002, 223pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271022280.

Reviewed by Herman Rapaport, University of Southampton


John T. Lysaker isn’t the first person to imagine a productive interlocution between Martin Heidegger and contemporary Anglo-American poetry, though he is certainly first in terms of mounting a lengthy encounter between Heidegger and Pulitzer Prize winner, Charles Simic. Well known is that Heidegger himself was quite reluctant to interface with just anyone, let alone poets who weren’t part of a very select group: Hölderlin, Rilke, Trakl, George, and Benn. No doubt, Heidegger was after a philosophical poetics that, for a start, disabled the distinction between the two (the philosophical and the poetic), and he saw in Hölderlin a mighty precursor for doing just this. It’s already here that I have some misgivings about Lysaker’s book, because poets like Simic aren’t anywhere close to the kind of philosophical or poetic accomplishment that would be required to deconstruct the relation between poetry and philosophy. For example, I could imagine a study on Dante that began to broach some of these issues, or a study on Goethe, since in these cases one is really dealing with immense genius. But putting such a burden on figures like Simic seems inappropriate, and, in my estimation, the book falls apart rather quickly on account of it.

If there is something salvageable in this book, it’s Lysaker’s idea that we shouldn’t reduce the arts to some sort of abstract research project (inspired by British utilitarianism and abetted by Yankee know-how), but should submit to the transformative potential of the work of art, vis-à-vis our hermeneutical encounter with it. If one reads, say, Roman Ingarden on the cognition of the work of art, it’s quite apparent that it never occurred to him that the work of art might actually have the capacity to change the reader, let alone, to produce some kind of spiritual rebirth. Hans-Georg Gadamer, too, keeps an arm’s length from books changing your life, though I think it’s implied pretty much everywhere in his work that if we’re not changed, we haven’t really understood much. Bildung, essentially, is the mediation of consciousness by the tradition that transforms it, and, of course, for Heidegger the mediation of German poetry was crucial for philosophy, because it transformed the language of philosophy.

What has changed since the 1960s in America, and I would suppose also in Great Britain, is the fact that poetry is no longer so highly regarded, because we’re not of the view that it has this transformative capacity. We may enjoy reading Jorie Graham or C.K. Williams or Rita Dove, but these writers don’t change our lives, they just interest us for a while. In fact, these poets have nothing to say to philosophy, because their words reflect feelings, attitudes, situations, or conundrums that have no intellectual force of a transcendental sort. In other words, there’s nothing wesentlich that’s being said, because so much of what’s being discussed is quite trivial in the broad scheme of things. This is precisely where someone like John Ashbery emerges as a rather strong poet, given that he acknowledges this dilemma as hermeneutically foundational, whereas someone like Simic seems merely caught in the headlights of banality.

Conceptually, Simic isn’t very noteworthy. At least, I can’t work up much philosophical respect for Simic’s

A worm
In an otherwise
Red apple
Said: I am. (quoted in Lysaker)

Still, let’s turn for a moment to the Heidegger part of Lysaker’s enterprise. Lysaker, like many of us, can warm up to that incantatory talk about the open, dwelling, nearness, the four-fold, and Ereignis. I suspect he likes it because it’s really a closeted theology whose terms are acceptable to agnostic colleagues. Certainly, its undercurrent is kerygmatic. Art, we’re being told, is the proclamation of a spiritual event (a happening, advent, waiting) that opens us up to Being (really, God). The problem is less that art is thought to do this (which is Lysaker’s emphasis), than that Lysaker works so hard at trying to throw everyone off the theological track. He knows we’re all scared to be caught in bed with metaphysics because we’ve been taught by the French that it’s not the thing to do in Paris.

Analogously, in the world of Anglo-American poetry, we’ve had the problem of poets struggling to say spiritual things in non-spiritual ways. Eliot sort of managed to keep the high church in. But after World War II, this became much harder to sustain, because it seemed unlikely to most intellectuals that God and the concentration camp could exist in the same historical frame of reference. The problem after 1945 wasn’t whether one could or couldn’t write poetry after the Holocaust, but whether one could write credible poetry that had some serious spiritual dimension that one could respect. So far, only a very few poets seem to have really succeeded: Celan, Bachmann, Ponge, Char, Beckett, Auden, Prynne, Oppen, Ashbery … .

Lysaker’s chapters go something like this. (1) “Heidegger’s Ear” maps Lysaker’s Heidegger onto American poets, among them, Wallace Stevens, whose poetry exemplifies a notion of Ort or place. Ort is defined as referentiality that eludes representation as the condition of its possibility, something that Stevens’ “The Palm at the End of the Mind” exemplifies (in part). Ort means other things too. For example, it’s the place of the origination of the work, its Ur condition. No problem here. And no problem with Lysaker’s apt reference to Rilke. It’s when Lysaker decides that Garrett Hongo’s lines (“the great albacore run of the Sixties…”) need to be discussed in this context that one will necessarily wonder if Heidegger isn’t turning over in his grave. After all, for Heidegger a poet isn’t just someone who can scribble down some lines that sound and look like poetry. Rather a poet is a legislator of language in the sense of legislating the future of a Volk. Hongo (whose marketing device is that he is of Asian descent and comes from Hawaii) isn’t legislating anything for anyone. And, of course, the question to be asked is why, because it’s a question that would pertain to the hundreds of would-be American poets (many with signature ethnicities) who are on the pay roll of state and private institutions. What is it about their work that makes it so terribly insignificant at a time when the West is in perhaps its deepest spiritual crisis since the decline of the Middle Ages, the very same spiritual decline that Heidegger was pointing to in his war time seminars?

(2) “Living Poetry.” Here we get some sixties-speak about poems being about poems (remember metafiction?). But whatever Heidegger was thinking, it wasn’t metafiction. Similarly incongruous is Lysaker’s idea that Heidegger (an ex-Nazi) and Adrienne Rich (a radical lesbian with no use for men) are on the same page, poetically speaking. Here I think one would be justified if one responded with incredulity. And if not at the Rich connection, then at the connection with Ammons’ Garbage when, for example, we’re told with a straight face that a garbage mound transforms matter to spirit.

(3) “The White of All ’I’s.’“ Here Lysaker turns to Simic who, apparently, had his own thoughts about Heidegger. I think Simic really sounds Lysaker’s overall thesis when he writes (apropos of Ort, the Ur poem, etc.): “Paradoxically, what is most important in a poem, that something for which we go back to it again and again, cannot be articulated. The best one can do… is give the reader a hint of what one has experienced reading the poem, but was unable to name.” (p. 79) When all explanation fails, Simic says, quote the poem literally. The issue is quite simple: there’s a desire to consummate the poem in order to expunge lack. What appears irritating for Simic and Lysaker is that the poem (really, any work of art) won’t resolve itself in terms of some pure denotation that can be appropriated fully. Hence Heidegger is called in to minister to this problem.

In (4) “Ink,” “Ur-poetry’s power lies in its ability to expose and figure the origins of sense” (135), and “In Simic’s ur-poetry, origination is marked by the white, a radically anterior event that has always already transpired by the time sense is present” (137). The issue is poetry’s hypokeimenon, its ground, which Simic associates with “white.” In Derridean terms this is deferral, the arche-trace. Of course, one finds it in Beckett (Krapp’s Last Tape), in Joyce (Finnegans Wake), in Melville (Moby Dick), the upshot being that one wonders why such a fuss about it is being made here. Hasn’t Simic just done rather more conventionally what has been done far more aggressively and adventuresomely in the past?

Chapters (5) “Characterizing the Cosmos,” (6) “Then Came History” and (7) “Preserving the Possible,” carry the ur-poetics of Simic onwards. In (6) Lysaker says of history that it is a ground word, “a figure of poetising.” Fair enough. But why then not deal with a poet like Milton who actually was in history. Or Celan? Why are we dealing with poets like Stevens, buried in the insurance business, or, like Simic, the education business (which is somewhat similar)? Why all this concern with history, as the book enters into its latter stages? Because what came before isn’t important enough?

This gets at a core problem with Lysaker’s book, something that is odd, given that Heidegger is such a critical presence. The difficulty in dealing with mainstream academic American poets is that unlike Goethe or George or Celan, they aren’t authentic historical beings, but social bystanders who belong to the same consumerist world of work that everyone else does. Like the rest, they’re flies trapped in the bell jar of the American Dream, with its Martha Stewarts, its strip malls, its Pizza Huts, its Columbines, its crass fundamentalisms, its blahed out kids, its super-this-and-that, its shoot-em-up foreign wars. In that sense, Ammons’ term, garbage, is absolutely on target. For it’s not that these poets don’t or can’t voice their displeasure (as Rich has; as the whole MFA establishment in America does – which is its chief raison d’etre for writing poetry), but that it doesn’t matter, because none of these literary figures is willing to risk anything that would move them from being ordinary consumer citizens to being a political thorn in the side of society; as a result, they fail to enter into history, as, say, Catholic resisters in Northern Ireland have done.

It’s no secret that American poets desperately want to live the good life of the middle class citizen and complain about it too. In fact this is a role that American academia encourages, because this is the easiest way to pretend you have free speech without its having any historical efficacy. (Stanley Fish’s: “There’s No Such Thing as Free Speech and a Good Thing too.”) Perhaps the last time the American academy came anywhere close to breaking into history was back in May of 1970 when students were shot by the National Guard at Kent State University. For about 48 hours America hovered on the brink of civil war and the government cowered. But where was poetry then? Which poet poetized another destiny for America at that point, one in which a nation could rise up against Kauf-Mensch and Kauf-hof, the suburb, an unpopular and idiotic foreign war, a blatantly corrupt government, and an appalling racist society? Why had no national poet arisen to catapult the nation into the violence of rectitude? Of course, one could and should ask that of Heidegger himself in the dark days of the Reich. (Dietrich Bonhoeffer protested and was murdered by the Nazis, whereas Heidegger stayed the course at the University of Freiburg.) And, of course, that should alert us to why it is one might want to view with some suspicion what happens when American academics use Heidegger in the way Lysaker does: not to find a way into history, but to implicitly justify a way of sitting it out, the rhetoric notwithstanding. That said, there is this “other” Heidegger who also knew what it would mean for one to step courageously into the violent stream of history in order to legislate a better world. That Heidegger himself couldn’t live up to this task revealed an appalling weakness in an otherwise great thinker. And from it we should learn the meaning of the difference between what Hölderlin called Blödigkeit and Dichtermut: timidity and courage. This is one of the philosophical underpinnings of the philosophy/poetry connection that I find lacking in Lysaker’s understanding of the current condition of poetry writing in much of America today.