You Must Change Your Life

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Peter Sloterdijk, You Must Change Your Life, Wieland Hoban (tr.), Polity, 2013, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780745649214.

Reviewed by Eduardo Mendieta, Stony Brook University


Peter Sloterdijk is a professor of aesthetics and philosophy at the University of Arts and Design in Karlsruhe and the Academy of Fine Arts in Vienna. He hosted until 2012 the German television cultural program Im Glashaus: Das philosophische Quartett (In the Glass Palace: The Philosophical Quartet). He writes often for the German and French press. And from a distance, it would appear as though he publishes a book every four or five months. Sloterdijk is a publishing machine, but each book is highly original and provocative, if only because it is woven around the most unexpected recoveries of important but now forgotten texts. He became famous with his Critique of Cynical Reason (1983), a best seller in Germany and Europe. Between 1998 and 2004, he published the three-volume Spheres, considered his magnus opus -- an English translation of volume one appeared in 2011, and the translation of volume two is scheduled to appear in fall 2014. Spheres is a monster of a book, full of neologisms, images, and the display of the most improbable reading habits.

Early in volume one Sloterdijk declares that these books should be read as the other half of Heidegger's Being and Time, i.e., as an ontotopology. Yet, Sloterdijk is not Heideggerian, or if he is, he is what one can call a 'left Heideggerian,' by which one can mean someone who uses Heidegger against Heidegger, or who thinks after Heidegger, following him, but also going beyond. As a left Heideggerian, Sloterdijk has also provided some of the most incisive internal critiques of Heidegger's philosophical project in his Nicht gerettet: Versuche nach Heidegger (2001) (Not Saved: Essays after Heidegger -- my literal translation of the title), which includes the now much debated but little understood lecture "Rules for the Human Zoo."[1] Sloterdijk, and this may not be widely known, has also written extensively on Nietzsche. In fact, before declaring Sloterdijk a left Heideggerian, one should name him a "left Nietzschean." Here I would refer to his Thinker on Stage: Nietzsche's Materialism (1989) andNietzsche Apostle (2013)

Yet, while Sloterdijk has been busy reading and interpreting key German thinkers in innovative ways, he has also been a cosmopolitan European thinker and writer, as evidenced by his numerous readings of French, English, and even American writers and thinkers. In fact, there is a collection of Sloterdijk's engagement with French thinkers, titled Mein Frankreich (2013) (My France). His omnivorous and postnationalistic reading habits are also amply displayed in his philosophical diary Zeilen und Tage: Notizen 2008-2011 (2012) (Lines and Days: Notes 2008-2011), and his fresh from the press Die schrecklichen Kinder der Neuzeit: Über das anti-genealogische Experiment der Moderne (2014) (The enfant terrible of Modernity: On the anti-genealogical experiment of the modern). These bibliographical references are marshaled in order to establish that Sloteridjk is more than an academic philosopher. He is a public intellectual in the European public sphere. He is a letrado, a man of letters, a writer, and a cultural diagnostician. I would argue that his book belongs on the same shelf as those of Simone de Beauvoir, Michael Foucault, Jürgen Habermas, Luce Irigaray, Sigmund Freud, Friedrich Nietzsche, Richard Rorty, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Ivan Illich, to name the most heterodox and most influential, those who gave us new lexicons and new metaphors.

Turning now to You Must Change Your Life, we can clearly see Sloterdijk's debt to Nietzsche, but also to Foucault. Like most of his books, this is a massive tome. If Spheres is his rethinking ontology and metaphysics as a metaphorology and ontotopology, this book is his ethics and philosophical anthropology. It also articulates Sloterdijk's philosophy of history, and thus should be read in tandem with the recently translated In the World Interior of CapitalTowards a Philosophical Theory of Globalization (2013).

The book's title comes from a line in the poem "Archaic Torso of Apollo" by Rainer Maria Rilke, which Sloterdijk takes to give expression to what he considers the "absolute imperative -- the quintessential metanoetic command" (25), the imperative that overshoots both hypothetical and categorical imperatives. To submit to any ethical imperative presupposes the practice of submitting to a transformation, an askesis of self-overcoming. If for Nietzsche the human being was the mangled being, for Sloterdijk the human is the creature of excesses; the animal from which "too much is demanded" and above all, the animal that demands of itself the improbable (443). Humans, therefore and most fascinatingly, are structurally "superior to themselves, and carry within themselves an asymmetry in which they mould and are moulded." (328) This structural condition reveals what Sloterdijk calls, appropriating Helmuth Plessner's language, an "eccentric potential in humans."

Humans are creatures of distance, of the distance from themselves, from others, from the world, from their own world schemas. Human eccentricity allows humans to "step out of the river of life and take residence on the shore. . . . All increases of a mental or bodily kind begin with a secession from the ordinary." (217) Ethics is precisely this secession from the quotidian and the accepted, and calls for the production of new spaces of subjectivity and agency. As such, ethics is a heterotopological askesis. Secession is a topological askesis, for it generates spaces in which we can dwell, engaging in new practices and leading to new levels of achievement. In as much as the human being is the creature that is always outside itself, or rather, who is lifted upwards on the vertical axis of its inner elevation, the human is also an acrobat. The acrobat is the Nietzschean creature who swings on the trapeze that extends between the mere human and the trans-human (the so-called superman). For Sloterdijk, then, the human being is fundamentally a creature of habits, of practices, of exercises. Human beings are born, sustained, and transcend through repetition. They are therefore what their habits make of them. Before we are the performance of our freedom, we are the performer of practices and exercises that subjectivize us.

Sloterdijk, then, transforms philosophical anthropology into a "general ascetology," and ethical theory is a subdivision within it. Inasmuch as human beings are "inescapably subject to vertical tensions" we always find them dwelling in contests of achievement and hierarchies of accomplishment (12). Another dimension of this general ascetology is that it is also a contribution to the critique of myth. A very important if subordinate corollary of the book's general thesis is that "a return to religion is as impossible as a return of religion -- for the simple reason that no 'religion' or 'religions' exist, only misunderstood spiritual regimes." (3) Religion is in fact a spiritualization of askesis, enabled by the secessions that allow us to withdraw from the river of life, the absorption in the mundane. Religion, in Sloterdijk's view, is another chapter in the biography of Homo artista, another name for the conquest of improbabilities, another way of demanding from humans the monstrous and excessive, another way to impose upon ourselves the absolute metanoetic imperative.

Sloterdijk also declares that his book is an attempt at a biography of Homo immunologicus (10). An immunity is what allows a living organism to be autopoetic while surviving in its habitat, but immunities are also what allow cultures to become cultures. An immunity system is understood by Sloterdijk as an "embodied" expectation of both injury and systems of protection and healing. It is precisely because humans are eccentric that they are also Homo immunologicus. Eccentricity or exocentricity renders humans ontologically vulnerable. Humans are thus creatures of corporeal and symbolic injurability. The human condition is one of radical exposure. Interestingly, for Sloterdijk that exposure, or injurability, can come from without but also from within. What he calls secession, the stepping out of the Heraclitian river of mundane existence, requires recession, the stepping back or over one's own internal spaces, a retreat to what he also calls "shore subjectivity." (227)

We can now understand why for Sloterdijk a general ascetology is the Janus face of a general immunology. For if the human being is the created creature of its habits, key among its habits is the one relating to the practices of defense, healing, and overachieving leaping. Exposure is itself a habit, the habit of pushing the boundary of what protects us as it renders us vulnerable. Practice makes perfect, but it also makes permanent. It is against the permanence of certain habits that Homo repetitivus must practice the pursuit of the excessive, the sublimity of virtuosity, or unparalleled performance. The practicing creature thus is the Homo artista, the performer of the excellence of human training. We arrive at a new definition of the human: the creature in ceaseless training.

You Must Change Your Life is then an essay on world history. It offers "general immunology" as the interpretative key. "All history is the history of immune system battles." (451), which leads Sloterdijk to diagnose that, for the current state of the world, no "efficient co-immunity structure" has been developed for the members of "global society." (450) How he characterizes the present state of the planet is worthy of foregrounding. We are poised between, on the one side,

an actual integration disaster in progress -- that of globalization, launched by Columbus' voyage in 1492, set moving by the Spanish conquest of the Aztec empire in 1521, accelerated by world trade between the seventeenth and nineteenth centuries, and driven along to the point of an effective synchronization of world events thanks to the quick media of the twentieth century (447)

and, on the other, "a disintegration disaster is in progress, heading for a crash whose time is uncertain, but which cannot be delayed indefinitely." (447-8) What this condition calls for is the metanoetic imperative that is specifically addressed to our planetary conditions. Here, Sloterdijk reaches out to Hans Jonas, who demonstrated that the owl of Minerva does not always take flight at twilight, when he enunciated his new version of the categorical imperative thusly: "Act in such a way that the effects of your actions can be reconciled with the permanence of true human life on earth." (448) This command "makes the harsh demand of embracing the monstrosity of the universal in its concretized form. It demands of us a permanent stay in the overtaxing-field of enormous improbabilities." (448) Ethics is precisely this "overtaxing field," the horizon of excessive demands, which are always partly met with the aid of practices of immunity and exercises of self-overcoming, the askesis of perfectionist enactment. Whoever submits to the metanoetic imperative "you must change your life" submits to the maxim: "'always behave in such a way that the account of your development could serve as the schema for a generalizable history of completion!'" (253) From the perspective of the contemporary ecological crisis of the planet, and the humanity caught between the centrifugal and centripetal pull of two ongoing disasters, the ascetic imperative demands the development a "global co-immunity" structure, "with respectful inclusion of individual cultures, particular interests and local solidarities." When such a global co-immunity order is established, then

Humanity becomes a political concept. Its members are no longer travelers on the ship of fools that is abstract universalism, but workers on the consistently concrete and discrete project of a global immune design. Although communism was a conglomeration of a few correct ideas and many wrong ones, its reasonable part -- the understanding that shared life interests of the highest order can only be realized within a horizon of universal co-operative asceticism -- will have to assert itself anew sooner or later. It presses for a macrostructure of global immunizations: co-immunism. (451-52)

Here we can see why Sloterdijk is not a neo-con, or a conservative Aristotelian, or a putative Nietzschean amoralist. On the contrary, we are able to appreciate the ethical thrust of his thinking.

I cannot close without underscoring that this text is full of extremely incisive and provocative readings of not only writers such as Rilke, Kafka, Cioran, and Ron Hubbard, but also philosophers and thinkers like Gehlen, Hadot, Heidegger, Nietzsche, Plessner, Wittgenstein, and many others. Sloterdijk criticizes Bourdieu for his reductivist reading of the concept of habitus, and provides correctives and supplements to Foucault's genealogies and biopolitics. Whether or not in the end the reader is persuaded by the argument that general immunology replaces metaphysics, and that a general ascetology becomes the prima philosophia of the creature of excesses and distances, the book should be read. This is because of the biographical meta-narrative that it provides of Homo Immunologicus, qua Homo repetitivus, qua man the artist of trapeze acts, of vertical jumps over and beyond itself. At the very least, this book should be read because of the pleasure of the text, the vigor of the writing, the novelty of the language. Philosophy should also be the poetry of language, the utopia of thinking. Sloterdijk has constructed in this beautiful text a supreme heterotopology -- a place from which to think and see differently.

[1] For a translation see: P. Sloterdijk, "Rules for the Human Zoo: a response to the Letter on Humanism," Environment and Planning D: Society and Space Vol. 27, No.1 (2009): 12-28.