"You've Changed": Sex Reassignment and Personal Identity

Placeholder book cover

Laurie J. Shrage (ed.), "You've Changed": Sex Reassignment and Personal Identity, Oxford UP, 2009, 220pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195385700.

Reviewed by Patricia Marino, University of Waterloo



“You’ve Changed” is a thoughtful and engaging collection of eleven philosophical essays on sex reassignment, from a range of scholars with varying points of view. This book is unusual in the degree to which it brings philosophical rigor and depth to questions of ordinary life: In what way is my sex identity part of my overall identity? Is sex primarily an embodied, social, or experienced identity? How can we create a world in which everyone’s sexual identity is respected? The book also shows the reader glimpses of important entailments in the other direction — that is, ways in which our reflections on these local questions challenge our background theories and methods. The writing is interesting and lively, and there is a well-organized and insightful introduction by the editor, Laurie Shrage.

Naturally, this book will be of interest to those working in gender and sexuality studies, queer studies, feminist philosophy, and science studies. But it should also be of interest to those interested in the epistemological, metaphysical, and moral aspects of personal identity. The theorizing here offers a set of reflections on identity from a new and important perspective, and several authors argue that ethics, politics and values are essential to understanding identity. This claim is worth considering from a broader perspective than just sex and gender.

These essays take up a large number of topics. Rather than trying to address all of these I’ll focus on a few broad themes. The first concerns the role of sex and gender in personal identity generally. In her “Sex, Gender, and Life-Changing Aspirations”, Christine Overall takes on a particularly metaphysical version of the identity question: when someone transitions in sex or gender, what changes, and what stays the same? Overall rejects the essentialist idea that the sex/gender identity of a person is part of a fixed core self that does not change as the person transitions. There are two ways to make sense of this essentialist idea: that sex and gender transitions function to hide one’s “true” sex/gender identity, i.e., the identity one had before the transition, and that it functions to reveal one’s “true” sex/gender, in this case, the identity one has taken on. Overall, correctly in my view, rejects the first of these as misguided since it requires either delusion or duplicity on the part of the trans person that we have no reason to attribute to them (pp. 13-14). But more controversially, she rejects the second as well. She bases this second rejection 1) on the pragmatic grounds that the “revealing” view reifies, and renders permanent and inflexible, one’s sex/gender identity, in ways feminists ought to find disturbing and 2) on the metaphysical grounds that it rests on an implausible mind-body dualism, since the mind is one, the body is another, and the mind reflects the true self.

Overall proposes instead the non-essentialist idea that transitions in sex/gender are similar to other life-changing alterations such as leaving or joining a religious order, becoming a mother, or immigrating to a new country. Georgia Warnke, too, in refocusing the question of sex/gender identity as a contextual and interpretive one, offers the analogy of changing nations. This way of understanding gender/sex reassignment emphasizes certain aspects of transitioning, e.g., its being an agent’s choice about a way to live and a way to be. As Overall says, one challenge for views like these, on which sex/gender transitioning is analogous to other chosen alterations in one’s identity, is that such views cannot account for the first-person experiences of those who say they have long felt that they were the other sex/gender, and that transitioning gave them an identity that finally matched their true selves. As various authors highlight here, such a feeling is common. Her reply is twofold: trans persons might be “reading back” into their histories the desire they have to change, thus to see their new identity as a previously existing different one, and the desire itself might have been of a lifetime’s duration (pp. 23-24).

In evaluating these replies, it matters to what degree these answers can be made to fit with the felt experience of the trans persons themselves. As C. Jacob Hale persuasively argues in his “Tracing a Ghostly Memory in My Throat: Reflections on Ftm Feminist Voice and Agency”, academic discussions of trans persons from non-trans theorists sometimes erase and pathologize elements of identity that are important and valuable. He is right to insist that metaphysical conclusions that deny felt experience of the persons described are unsatisfactory. If the feeling is sometimes experienced as a revealing, this does pose a difficulty with the analogies mentioned: after all, it is not strange to want to become Canadian, or Methodist, or a parent, but it would be strange to say that a person who becomes these things always “was” them. This forces us to ask, how can we understand the phenomenon of feeling born into a body of the opposite sex from one’s self? Can we make sense of true sexed identity without puzzling about mind-body dualism?

In her “Trans Identities and First-Person Authority”, Talia Mae Bettcher offers an illuminating way of reframing the identity issue, by recasting the question from a metaphysical one to an ethical and political one. Bettcher asks in what ways people ought to have First-Person Authority over their own attitudes, and over their own gendered conceptions of self. An epistemic account on which avowals of first-person attitudes are tied to self-knowledge can’t give us real authority, because of the frequency of self-deception, denial, and wishful thinking (p. 100). She proposes instead Ethical First-Person Authority. There are kinds of utterances — such as “I want to go home” — that carry with them a kind of authority, not because they cannot be false, but because they represent an agent taking responsibility for a desire of his own. To deny or ignore such an utterance is to undermine or fail to respect a person’s autonomy, and is in this way unethical. And Bettcher proposes that there is a kind of existential identity over which we have authority in this sense. This existential identity concerns not the metaphysical matter of what one is, but the existential matter of “who one is” — what one cares about, stands for, and is moved by (p. 110). It is in this sense that a person may truthfully claim a particular gender identity before having undertaken any of the physical steps of transitioning (p. 111). To fail to respect such existential self-identity — by trying, say, to ferret out whether person’s genital status conflicts with his or her gender identifications — is unethical in the same sense of denying an agent’s autonomy.

The natural question is why, in the relevant cases, we ought to consider existential rather than metaphysical identity. Bettcher gives several reasons for taking existential identity to be central in an explanation of First-Person Authority over sex and gender, including that “existential rather than metaphysical self-identity illuminates the centrality of reasons in conferring intelligibility on a person’s act of self-identifying” (p. 111). But whether one finds this convincing may rest on whether one already accepts the idea that First-Person Authority in this domain is appropriate. It is not clear how this will convince the person who starts from the point of view that metaphysical identity is what matters. It is also somewhat obscure how commitments to what one cares about or stands for can be gendered. What value commitments ought one to have to say that “I am a woman” is an answer to the existential question of self-identity?

A second topic concerns whether feminism and trans activism and theorizing are at odds. Tension between the two forms a background to this book, and explains why one of its stated aims is “bridge building” (p. 5). The tension has several sources. Feminists hoping to preserve women-only space — as in single-sex schools and institutions — may see the possibility of women who used to be men as threatening to undermine the relevant criteria and motivations. And if understanding oppression is particularly important to feminists’ projects, the idea of transitioning from woman to man raises the uncomfortable possibility that one is escaping from womanhood by simply giving up on it. People don’t generally seem to change race, and if they did this would not be a politically neutral choice. If the analogy is apt, transitioning could be a kind of selling out. Is changing sex and gender like changing race?

From the point of view of most authors here, the answer is “No.” As Cressida Heyes sees it, it is partly because one’s racial identity derives from one’s ancestors that race and sex change are not simply the same. In articulating a positive view bringing the feminist and trans activist projects together, Hale’s essay, already mentioned, gives a conceptualization of selfhood aimed at showing their consistency. The idea, he says, is to place our moral and political values closer to the center of our selfhood than our gendered identity (p. 59). This is a promising direction, but it points to the need for more theorizing about what those moral and political values will be. Both respect for personal autonomy and solidarity are relevant here; since these can conflict, we need to know how to incorporate both into an overall outlook. Feminists and trans activists won’t inevitably share the same political goals; in a world of scarce resources, there may be disagreements over whether these are best used addressing women’s health issues or helping those who want access to hormone treatments and so on.

In her “Sex and Miscibility”, Laurie Shrage offers a different and more radical proposal for addressing these difficulties: to consider resisting sex classification altogether. This does not require giving up on cultural categories of male and female — as long as they are attuned to various complexities and deployed in particular ways, these can be useful. But it does mean giving up on those uses that perpetuate wrong ideas about sex differences, and also on the insistence on classifying everyone into one category. We should, she says, be comfortable with the fact that for some persons, sex is indeterminate. As she acknowledges, distinctions of sexual orientation will be also be complicated by such a shift, forcing us to figure out just when sex, gender, and orientation categories help promote liberatory political ideals and when they inhibit these — an important but clearly difficult question about which there may also be disagreement.

A third matter I want to explore concerns sex reassignment and the body. In her “Queer Breasted Experience”, Kim Q. Hall shows how trans perspectives complicate the commonplace and even canonical feminist idea that one ought to seek to love one’s body as it is, and that the only important barrier standing in the way of doing so is cultural oppression. The experiences of trans persons challenge this idea: a person who identifies as a man but has a body with breasts may well experience those breasts as foreign to himself; in this case to recommend efforts toward acceptance is inappropriate. On a related theme, Diana Tietjens Meyers’s “Artifice and Authenticity” uses art to explore how body transformations can be seen as expressions of autonomy rather than as the result of cultural pressures to conform.

Hall and Meyers are convincing in their claims that some kinds of body-estrangement and bodily changes are legitimate expressions of self, and are to be celebrated rather than shunned. This, of course, raises many difficult questions. How can we tell which changes these are? As Shrage says in her introduction, some body-modifications such as extreme dieting and breast-enlargement have been associated with “culturally induced low self-esteem” (p. 8). To what extent, then, shall we trust the agent’s own claims about her motivations? If a woman insists that, say, breast enlargement enables her self-expression, on what grounds may we object? It cannot be simply the desires of men that make the difference between authentic and inauthentic desires for bodily change, since one’s authentic desires may have different sources. If the desire for getting rid of one’s breasts can be authentic, and the desire for breasts one does not have can be authentic, why not the desire for bigger breasts than one already has?

Let me close with a note on Naomi Zack’s “Transexuality and Daseia Y. Cavers-Huff”. Here, Zack reflects on a late colleague — the Dr. Cavers-Huff of the title — who habitually transgressed the implicit norms for being a philosophy professor, by wearing a leopard skin hat to her dissertation defense, flaunting diamonds from pawn shops, boasting of her sexual prowess, and having cosmetic surgery. Zack says that that Cavers-Huff represented transgression and freedom, and that we — we philosophers — would be wise to follow in her footsteps. That is, we would be better off putting in the work to embrace wider-ranging, more varying ways of life, both as a ticket to intellectual freedom and as a way of connecting with the wider world around us. With this last recommendation I wholeheartedly agree.