Yuck! The Nature and Moral Significance of Disgust

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Daniel Kelly, Yuck! The Nature and Moral Significance of Disgust, MIT Press, 2011, 194pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780262015585.

Reviewed by Tom Cochrane, Queen's University Belfast


In this book, Daniel Kelly provides a new model of the emotion of disgust, providing an in-depth characterisation of its functional nature before exploring the role that it plays in our moral lives. The book is written in a clear and engaging style, with the overall argumentative structure well signposted throughout. Kelly is particularly concerned to address the empirical literature relating to disgust and manages to produce a model that plausibly accommodates the various observations regarding this emotion. If there was one concern I had with regard to overall strategy, it was that some of the trickier philosophical issues had not been addressed, concerning for instance the intentionality of the emotion -- to what extent our response is about, rather than simply caused by, its object. Kelly also disavows an in-depth examination of the phenomenology of disgust (p.153 fn. 3). Such discussions would not only have provided a more comprehensive treatment of the emotion, but may well have impacted on our understanding of its essential nature, including what makes it an emotion at all. Let us take Kelly's book on its own terms, however, and examine the issues that it does address.

The book is divided into five chapters. In chapter one, Kelly draws from the empirical literature to provide a general profile of disgust that any model of the emotion must account for. This includes an affect programme associated with nausea that involves the characteristic facial expression, certain physiological responses, as well as immediate behavioural withdrawal. A second important component which Kelly calls 'core disgust' involves a more cognitive and sustained sense of the target's offensiveness and a sensitivity towards its contaminating potential. Kelly says that these responses form a stable or homeostatic cluster, in the sense that they regularly appear as a package (p. 33). Meanwhile, Kelly draws our attention to the highly various natures of disgust elicitors, both with respect to the wide range of objects that trigger a single subject's disgust response, as well as the different things that different people find disgusting. Disgust, then, displays a notable flexibility with regard to elicitation, in combination with a relatively inflexible set of responses.

One point that I found dubious in this chapter was the notion that we cognitively draw up a 'database' of disgust elicitors, as if the brain scrolls through a look-up table checking for matches and then triggers the programmed response if a match obtains. While there may be certain sensory qualities that are innately set-up to trigger our disgust response, it seems reasonable to suppose that emotional responses are not simply along the lines of 'x is present; trigger behaviour y', but rather more sensitively interact with the object at hand, such that the more specific nature of the property influences the nature of the reaction (we react differently to disgusting tastes, sights, and tactile sensations at least). Moreover, rather than simply listing different elicitors, the process of learning a new disgust trigger may be the consequence of acquiring the ability to perceive anew in that elicitor a more general property of disgustingness (e.g., as violating a norm or boundary, as potentially entering one's body) that is the more proximal trigger of the response and is the more proper intentional object of the emotion.

Chapter two is principally concerned with the evolutionary provenance of disgust and revolves around a puzzle concerning the apparent uniqueness of the human disgust response. Kelly identifies two distinct mechanisms at work; a taste aversion response and a parasite avoidance response. Both of these mechanisms are to be found in other animals, yet Kelly claims that only in humans have they become 'entangled' or functionally integrated within a single emotion. This 'entanglement thesis' is one of the most striking claims in the book and many of his later claims rely on its plausibility. This is because the parasite avoidance mechanism possesses the generality and flexibility that can be adapted to more cognitive cases of disgust, while the taste aversion response provides the robust and characteristic profile that will go on to play a role in the social function of the emotion.

Kelly suggests that taste aversion has become entangled with parasite avoidance primarily as a consequence of the adaptive problems we faced as omnivorous creatures -- particularly with respect to the relatively recent addition of meat to our diets. Other species feeding on carrion seem to have had the time to develop more robust digestive systems. In humans in contrast, our pre-possessed aversion mechanisms could be readily combined to deal with the new adaptive pressure. While Kelly provides a plausible evolutionary story here, I am uncertain that what we observe is indeed a single functionally integrated emotion mechanism. For instance, there is a difference between cases where one's face wrinkles in disgust at the notion of consuming something, and the sense of one's skin crawling when contemplating touching certain items. (This second case may or may not correspond to the parasite avoidance mechanism; Kelly claims that a central feature of this mechanism is contamination sensitivity, of which skin crawling may be an appropriate manifestation.) While both reactions can often appear together, it seems that they can appear separately, so I am uncertain how closely linked the two responses must be to qualify as a single emotion. Similarly, Kelly does not make it clear if both mechanisms must necessarily be activated to qualify as a genuine case of (human) disgust.

Note also that evidence for the separateness of the two mechanisms will always be in tension with claims for their entanglement in humans. The best evidence for the existence of genuinely distinct mechanisms is their separate appearance in other animals. But in humans, parasite avoidance simply develops later in life than taste aversion. Why in this case think that our parasite sensitivity is a mechanism like that possessed by certain other animals? Could it not be that our more sophisticated causal reasoning simply allows us to respond more widely to a basic disgust response? Kelly may respond that there is a distinctive kind of behaviour, most likely the sensitivity to contamination, that makes the parasite avoidance response look like a distinctive cognitive mechanism. But again, if we have reason to think there is a distinct mechanism for contamination-type thinking or acting, this claim simultaneously undermines the case for saying the mechanisms are genuinely entangled in the case of disgust, since one would not appear without the other. At the very least then, we should ask for a more detailed account of exactly what entanglement amounts to.

Chapter three is focused on the expressive behaviours associated with disgust, which Kelly notes are largely involuntary and difficult to fake. In explaining why we so readily express our disgust, as well as recognise it in other people, Kelly appeals to the theory of cultural transmission. According to this theory, the facial gape of disgust which was originally adapted for expulsion or resisted intake of food has been co-opted to serve a social signalling function, allowing us to quickly learn from others what items in the environment should be avoided. This model contrasts with a 'classic commitment model', adapted from the work of Robert Frank, according to which the expression of emotions convincingly signals to others our commitment to certain behaviours in order to strategically influence their behaviours. Unlike the Frank-type model, Kelly's model emphasises the cooperative nature of the emotional expression. After all, it is in our best interest that no-one within our community suffers from an infectious disease. Moreover, the Frank-type model fails to account for the empathic or contagious nature of our recognitions of disgust in others. We do not just react to the disgust of others, but often share that response. In this way disgust's signalling system can contribute to its acquisition system.

A minor quibble here is that Kelly perhaps over-emphasises the degree to which recognising the disgust response in others triggers the same reaction in ourselves. Certainly there is evidence (which Kelly reviews) that recognising the emotion involves some of the same mechanisms that are involved in actually experiencing it, but even if we engage in sub-conscious facial mimicry, and even if this generates characteristic feelings of that emotion, this falls short of our treating the target of the originator's disgust in the same way ourselves. Granted, however, there is evidence that children at least engage in the kind of social referencing that involves emotionally responding to items in the same way as caregivers have responded to them. And equally, extreme expressions of disgust may have a more robustly imitative result in humans. This is probably all that Kelly needs to make his point. We can at least agree that perceiving disgust in others puts us 'on alert' for potentially harmful items in our environment (p. 90).

Chapter four begins to explain the incorporation of disgust into the moral sphere, again with a focus on the evolutionary pressures involved. Kelly draws on very broad considerations regarding the social nature of humans, outlining the mutual influence between genes and culture, whereby there is feedback between the way that genes shape our cultural set-up, which are in turn modified by the sorts of cultural forms to which we are required to adapt (such as the following of norms). Kelly then focuses on ethnic markers, arguing that the disgust response has been co-opted to serve a role in enforcing group boundaries. Indeed, disgust seems to be especially well-suited to be co-opted in this way due to the flexibility of its inducers and the rigidity of its response (which serves the social function outlined in the previous chapter). As a consequence of being co-opted in this way, disgust serves the maintenance of purity norms and more generally our moral disgust for certain norm violations or out-group behaviours. While allowing that there may be a vague boundary between ordinary disgust and moral disgust (p. 128), Kelly argues that since the disgust response itself is identical to more primitive cases, moral disgust is no mere metaphorical application of the term.

One issue that concerned me here was that it was not clear exactly how disgust is co-opted to track social norms or ethnic boundaries. Evidently this has in fact occurred, but the key property that such items must display, or the psychological process involved, was not sufficiently analysed. Kelly gives us the resources to see how, once someone feels disgust in a moral case, that attitude can then propagate within a population. But we are left wondering how the response to that kind of object gets established in the first place. Kelly provides some clues -- in particular that our pre-established disgust for certain foods can be transferred to a disgust for people who partake in those foods (p. 123). But this is unlikely to account for all cases of disgust for norm violations or out-group signifiers. Kelly also suggests that disgust may be sensitive to abnormalities in general (p. 118), but such a feature looks too broad to specifically trigger disgust (for instance an eclipse is abnormal but does not disgust us). Similarly, why should we be disgusted, as opposed to shocked, angry, or embarrassed on behalf of the other when a social norm is broken?

Finally, chapter 5 evaluates the extent to which our sense of moral disgust should guide our moral judgements. This chapter would notably serve as a good stand-alone article for any discussion of moral psychology -- especially since it provides a useful précis of Kelly's argument in the book so far. Based on his model of this emotion, Kelly argues that we should not accord disgust any authority in our moral judgements. The mere fact that something is disgusting is not a robust guide even to the poisonous or infectious nature of items since the response is particularly prone to false positives. In our evolutionary past it was adaptive for our disgust response to be set on a hair trigger, since frequent false positives were less costly than the occasional failure to avoid something genuinely harmful. Moreover, the high degree of variation in what triggers the disgust strengthens scepticism regarding its reliability. Moral disgust simply latches onto prevailing social norms, thus a response of disgust can merely indicate that the subject has been brought up in a certain social group and, equally, failing to share that disgust response may indicate only that one does not happen to have been socialised in the same way. Again we should be wary of any normative assertion that a certain item merits a disgust response, since disgust easily slips into treating its targets as dirty and inhuman rather than simply wrong. This has all kinds of dangerous implications that we all too readily observe in past human atrocities. Overall, I found Kelly's argument here highly persuasive, and the claim has indeed been put on a surer footing as a result of Kelly's close examination of the nature of disgust.

In conclusion, this book is a stimulating and plausible discussion of disgust that is recommended to anyone interested in this emotion. The closer examination of certain details in Kelly's argument could, I think, potentially open up new problems to be addressed and afford us a deeper understanding of this emotion, and indeed emotions in general. But Kelly has provided the best kind of gateway for anyone interested in learning about disgust and its pervasive role in our society. In his introduction (p. 9), Kelly expresses a hope that his discussion will serve as an example for the way that certain broader issues in ethics may be addressed -- the sentimentalist notion that we project moral qualities onto objects, or the relationship between moral qualities and motivation for instance. I think he may well be right here. By looking closely at the functional nature of disgust, the highly complex and subtle workings behind a given motivational and evaluative attitude have been revealed.