Zarathustra's Secret. The Interior Life of Friedrich Nietzsche

Placeholder book cover

Kohler, Joachim, Zarathustra's Secret. The Interior Life of Friedrich Nietzsche, translation by Ronald Taylor, Yale University Press, 2002, 336pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0300092784.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, John F. Kennedy School of Government, Harvard University


Writing an ambitious biography that emphasizes Nietzsche’s sexuality, Köhler intends to show that Nietzsche was gay, and that this insight leads to a reinterpretation of his work. He claims that “Nietzsche’s intuitive philosophy cannot be understood apart from his profoundest experience of sexuality” (p xvii), and that a reconstruction of his hidden life leads to “a radically different picture of his philosophy” (p xi). Köhler assumes that “received views” of Nietzsche’s philosophy depend on the assumption that he is “a sexless intellectual with a walrus moustache” (p xii). In support of his claim that Nietzsche’s philosophy should be interpreted in light of his sexual experiences, Köhler quotes extensively from Nietzsche. Yet curiously, he does not address Nietzsche’s exclamation, in Ecce Homo, that his writings are one thing, and he himself is another (section 1 of Why I Write Such Good Books). Be that as it may, Köhler purports to discuss philosophy, and thus philosophers should take notice.

This book originally appeared in German in 1989, and the author decided to omit the second part of the original, a commentary on Thus Spoke Zarathustra. Köhler explains that any reader who followed his account would have no further need for guidance. If that is true, however, one wonders why German-speaking readers of the original do still need such guidance. Much in the book indeed prepares the grounds for Zarathustra: for instance, Köhler tells us repeatedly that Zarathustra draws on Nietzsche’s nightmares and fantasies as a fatherless child raised first under the strict regiment of his mother, grandmother, and paternal aunts, and later in the rigorous prep school of Pforta. Since the Zarathustra commentary is missing, we only learn bits and pieces about how such references may illuminate that work. There is no extended discussion of any of Nietzsche’s works, while the short remarks Köhler offers are sometimes inaccurate. For instance, on p 213, Köhler refers to the oppression of instincts depicted in the Genealogy, making it sound as if that passage gave an explanation for a given individual’s feelings of guilt. Yet it does not, at least not quite the way Köhler thinks; what Nietzsche explains there is something about the process of civilization that occurred in an early era and does lead to the bad conscience as we know it, but only mediated through other developments. Unfortunately, also, Köhler quotes the Colli-Montinari edition by volume only, and does not always tell us which work he is quoting.

So was Nietzsche gay? Personally, I have never cared much about Nietzsche’s sexuality, and Köhler has not convinced me that I should. But let us explore his case. Köhler shows that the hypothesis that Nietzsche was gay illuminates many episodes in his life, and that some contemporaries thought that he was gay. What more could one expect? While it is presumably not true of the European 19th century what Peter Brown says (in his The Body and Society) of late antiquity, namely, that it is a world irretrievably closed to us, we must keep in mind that in some regards Nietzsche’s was a different world indeed: the experience of diversity was limited; sexuality was not openly discussed, while homosexuality was often punishable by incarceration. (It did not just happen to Oscar Wilde in England.) Also, in Germany at least, a strong mentality of duty-bound service prevailed, not to the community, but to the emperor and to the Obrigkeit. Individual desires and ambitions were subject to an amount of social control alien to most of us. So it should be unsurprising that no direct evidence of Nietzsche’s homosexuality emerges. Still, some skepticism remains: there is no specific person with whom Köhler claims unambiguously that Nietzsche had a homosexual relationship, or with whom he longed to have one. No reference to a gay lover appears in Nietzsche’s writings, not even in a note book, although Nietzsche, for most of his sane life, had little reason to suspect that, one day, scholars would eagerly publish even material he had discarded. There are no such references even from the days when he was losing his mind and his grip on propriety to such an extent that he drafted a letter to the emperor. During those days, however, Nietzsche still thought of Cosima Wagner.

The evidence, then, is exclusively indirect. Telling, for instance, is a conversation, in 1876, about a self-portrait of Hans Holbein’s, of which Nietzsche said it displayed “lips made for kissing”—an observation that may not jump to a straight man’s mind. Less telling, for instance, is the episode of Nietzsche asking his student von Scheffler to join him for a vacation. Inappropriate as this presumably was, it is no indication of homosexuality, given that the competing hypothesis is that Nietzsche was a sensitive if perhaps socially somewhat maladjusted (but at any rate straight) man trying to connect to like-minded souls wherever he could reach them, and was often rebuked in that process. The famous episode of Wagner contacting Nietzsche’s physician appears as well: Wagner sent word to the doctor to inform him that excessive masturbation was responsible for Nietzsche’s health problems. Köhler interprets Wagner as lamenting about Nietzsche’s lack of intercourse with women. Köhler displays particular ingenuity by exploring yet another episode, which has puzzled Nietzsche biographers: In a letter to Nietzsche on his 33rd birthday, Paul Rée reminded him of an earlier joint stay in the village Bex, insisting that stay amounted to a picture of perfection “even if Stella had not been there.” So who is “Stella”? Offering his own answer, Köhler refers to a passage in Hölderlin’s Hyperion where the hero asks: “Do you know how Plato loved his Stella”? Stella, the Latin word for star, was a male character. Does Köhler mean to suggest that Rée and Nietzsche were gay lovers, at least briefly? Presumably, and then he goes on to say that it was Rée’s Jewish nose that turned Nietzsche off. This is as close as Köhler comes to actually connecting Nietzsche’s alleged homosexuality to a particular person.

Very illuminating is Köhler’s suggestion that Nietzsche went to Italy because it offered refuge to German homosexuals exiled from their own country. Long before Thomas Mann’s Aschenbach encountered the boy Tadzio, German homosexuals ventured south to find their own Tadzios. Köhler focuses on Nietzsche’s journey to Sicily in 1882, from which he seems to have emerged unusually well relaxed. We know nothing about what Nietzsche did in Sicily, but Köhler argues that he could not possibly have gone for any other reason than to seek homosexual encounters. (Köhler includes photographs of Sicilian adonises taken by a German photographer who had made a permanent transition from the cold, Protestant North of Germany to the allegedly sexually liberated South of Italy. What happened to the supervision of the Catholic Church down there?) Köhler writes as if that trip had been the culmination of Nietzsche’s homosexual life, whatever else that life amounted to.

Given this background, Köhler approaches Nietzsche’s failed proposal to Lou Salomé. Joining Rée and Salomé in Rome after returning from Sicily, Nietzsche was now seriously concerned about his reputation, says Köhler. “In Lou he found a soul who legitimized, stimulated and entertained him and who was desperately anxious to conceal that side of the female psyche which repelled him. She was not interested in sexual love” (p 205). The ideal match for Nietzsche, apparently, but Lou was not even interested in a sexless marriage with Nietzsche (useful to both of them to cover up what was deviant sexuality by the social standards of the time), though that is precisely what Friedrich Carl Andreas got later. So far from epitomizing Nietzsche’s failure with women, Lou was appealing to him because she was, as Rilke put it, a “female youth.” Once again, skepticism remains: if Nietzsche did not love her, why did this episode cause such agony? The origin of Nietzsche’s syphilis, by the way, according to Köhler, is to be found in a visit to a male brothel in Genoa, rather than a female brothel in Cologne.

Still, while there are lingering questions and no conclusive evidence, Köhler’s case is strong: he makes it a very real possibility that Nietzsche was gay. Yet granting that much, or more, for the sake of the argument, why should we care whether Nietzsche was gay if we are interested in his philosophy? After all, we do not have to consult Rousseau’s Confessions to learn about the social contract, though Rousseau reveals (in disgusting detail) precisely the kind of information that Köhler painstakingly reconstructs about Nietzsche. The best reason why we should care is Köhler’s claim that his approach throws light on Zarathustra, but, again, he omitted the part in which he would make good on that claim. As it is, the climax of Köhler’s book is chapter 12, like the book itself called “Zarathustra’s Secret.” That chapter, however, is unsatisfactory.

The core of chapter 12 is Köhler’s reflection on Nietzsche’s revelation-like experience in August 1881, when the thought of the eternal recurrence came to him. Köhler asks: “Whatever happened to Nietzsche by the lakeside on that August day in 1881 – why was he convinced that his vision had objective validity?” (p 233). He continues:

The answer is quite simple: it was not the recurrence as depicted on the shield that persuaded him but the recurrence of the shield itself. It had penetrated his consciousness long ago but he saw it as though for the first time. It seemed to be not an image preserved in his memory but a vision both unique and familiar from time immemorial. Something that had been forgotten for ages past but that now, like a flash of lightning, reappeared, recognizable down to the last detail (p 234).

This “shield” is the “shield of necessity, the tablet of eternal things” (p 232), the shield of Achilles, as Homer describes it in the Iliad. That shield, for Nietzsche, symbolized his Greek ideal at the purest. “Standing on the shore of the lake at Silvaplana … he suddenly found himself confronted by a vision of perfection, his beloved Arcadia.” From there Köhler continues to explain that the reoccurrence of that vision (both on that shield and in Nietzsche’s vision when standing on that lakeshore) persuaded Nietzsche of the “objective validity” of eternal recurrence.

I can offer no alternative account of what happened on that day in Silvaplana, but I hope it was not what Köhler claims it was. For if Nietzsche jumped to conclusions about the “objective validity” of the idea of eternal recurrence, which at any rate is about the repeated occurrence of everything, from the repeated appearance in his life of images that reminded him of classical Greece, his powers of inference would have been seriously impeded already in 1881. Fortunately, we have no reason to believe that this was so. Köhler’s reconstruction is the product of wildly implausible speculation. In a different approach Köhler traces the origin of eternal recurrence to Hölderlin’s Hyperion. The character Diotima (borrowed in turn from Plato’s Symposium) says there: “What is everything that men have thought and done over the centuries compared with just one moment of love?” (p 239). While there is a connection to Nietzsche’s idea of eternal recurrence, Köhler seems to overreach by suggesting that this idea “grew out of” Hölderlin’s “metaphysics of friendship” (p 239). Philosophers have asked different questions about eternal recurrence: is this most plausibly understood as a cosmological thesis, or a decision test, or an affirmation test, or something yet different? Can it replace the Categorical Imperative, the Ten Commandments, and the utilitarian calculus? While Köhler is not required to address these questions, his suggestions even fail to make eternal recurrence interesting. We never even learn just what Köhler thinks eternal recurrence is. He sometimes talks as if it had something to do with the return of an individual’s own past, but it is certain that that is not what it is.

Chapter 12 also deals with Nietzsche’s announcement of the death of God, which Köhler interprets in light of the death of Nietzsche’s father. Nietzsche’s deepest problem, throughout his life, was to come to terms with that death, says Köhler, and he never outgrew the nightmares triggered by this event. The language of the death of God finally enabled him to diagnose his condition—and the therapy was to endorse the eternal recurrence and the value of friendship allegedly captured therein. Yet at this stage, Köhler abandons philosophy altogether. While it is one thing to argue that ideas articulated only decades later resonate with a philosopher’s childhood experiences, it is quite another to write as if there were nothing more to them. What is philosophically interesting about Nietzsche’s announcement of the death of God is whether there is anything left to do for moral philosophy in the absence of the omnipotent, omniscient, and omnipresent deity of Christianity. Are Kantian ethics and utilitarianism, most prominently, only pale imitations of fragments of moral thought that are ultimately bound to collapse if the notion of God is discarded for justificatory purposes? Once again, Köhler is not required to address such questions, but he reduces Nietzsche’s writings to mere autobiography if he thinks the death of Nietzsche’s father is all there is to his reflections on the death of God.

This, then, is Zarathustra’s secret: Zarathustra, Nietzsche’s “son,” talks in cryptic terms about Nietzsche’s life itself, his experiences as a fatherless son, and his subsequent experiences as a homosexual condemned to hiding his inclinations. It is also Zarathustra who suggests the therapy: the pure ecstasy of friendship. Yet in addition to the concern articulated in the last paragraph, we are now also wondering what the connection is between Nietzsche’s alleged homosexuality, which seems to be part of what Zarathustra reveals, properly understood, and the eternal recurrence, or the superman (whom Köhler brings a bit too much in connection with Nietzsche’s Sicilian encounters, saying that Nietzsche “saw” the superman in Sicily (p 255)). Köhler insists that Nietzsche’s philosophy must be rethought once we come to terms with his homosexuality, but fails to explain why Nietzsche’s homosexuality even informs his idea of eternal recurrence. Just how do philosophers have to modify their thinking about eternal recurrence if that idea is proposed by a gay man with nightmares and fantasies, rather than a “sexless intellectual with a walrus moustache?” Would we have to rethink the Categorical Imperative if new research revealed that Kant and Lampe were gay lovers? It might well be possible that Nietzsche’s hidden homosexuality helps explain passages in Zarathustra; if so, it is so much more unfortunate that the Zarathustra commentary was excluded from the translation. For at least this reader is incapable of applying Köhler’s insights rewardingly to Nietzsche’s most notorious work without further assistance. But at any rate, the connection between Nietzsche’s hidden homosexuality and central themes, such as the death of God and eternal recurrence, remains obscure. Thus we still do not know why we should care about Nietzsche’s sexuality. This remains Köhler’s secret, and he guards it well.

Such dissatisfaction with Köhler’s book, I believe, is not motivated by philosophical esotericism. Surely, authors like Nietzsche must be kept accessible to the educated public, and no harm is done if such popularization sacrifices philosophical depth. Yet the doubts we have raised are not primarily philosophical doubts. They are doubts that arise just by asking straightforward questions about what Köhler is up to. Köhler’s book makes for a great read because it is fascinating and thought-provoking for what it is: a well-written biography about Nietzsche emphasizing his sexuality. But it does not force us to reconsider what matters about his philosophy.